2016.02.18

Harry G. Frankfurt

On Inequality

Harry G. Frankfurt, On Inequality, Princeton University Press, 2015, 120pp., $14.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691167145.

Reviewed by Paul Weithman, University of Notre Dame


In 2005, Harry G. Frankfurt published On Bullshit, which was a revised version of a previously published essay of the same name. Ten years later, he returned to his reservoir of previously published papers and issued On Inequality, which brings together slightly revised versions of "Economic Equality as a Moral Ideal" -- originally just "Equality as a Moral Ideal" -- and "Equality and Respect", published in 1987 and 1997 respectively. Some readers will wish that the essays had been updated to take account of literature on equality that has appeared in the meantime. But publication of the book was well timed to tap into the increasing interest in inequality among philosophers and economists, as well as in popular political culture. Online searches suggest that the book has already attracted considerable attention.

On Inequality attacks egalitarianism, which Frankfurt takes to be the family of views that hold that equality of some kind is a distributive ideal. The view Frankfurt favors is sufficientarianism, according to which what really matters is that people have enough to lead lives it would be reasonable for them to regard as satisfying. He hastens to add that he does not oppose policies intended to reduce inequality. Indeed, he insists that his arguments do not have any political implications at all. (pp. 65-66) His aim in this book is the strictly "conceptual or analytic" one of showing why we should care about inequality, especially economic inequality. (p. 65) He contends that we should not care about it because equality is valuable for its own sake.

Frankfurt's critiques of egalitarianism and his defense of sufficientarianism form a deep and original structure which is not readily apparent from his text. That structure is best brought to light by showing what Frankfurt says about someone who does not object to inequality as such, but who objects to having less than another because the inequality "suggest[s] to him that whoever is responsible for the discrepancy has failed to treat him with a certain kind of respect". (p. 77) I shall return below to what Frankfurt thinks distinguishes disrespectful and unequal treatment. For now, what matters is that Frankfurt takes them to differ and that he makes a point of distinguishing them because he thinks "the widespread tendency to exaggerate the moral importance of egalitarianism is due, at least in part, to a misunderstanding of the relationship between [the two]." (p. 77)

Having drawn the distinction, Frankfurt grants that the demands of equality and respect might coincide. One such case, Frankfurt says, is when "everyone is entitled to certain things just in virtue of being human" (p. 83) -- by which he presumably means "everyone is entitled to an equal amount of certain things" or "everyone is entitled to the same things". But in that case, Frankfurt says immediately, the requirement of equality is not grounded in the authority or moral value of egalitarianism. It is grounded in "the moral importance of responding impartially to [the recipients'] common humanity". (p. 84) Other traits Frankfurt says people share -- their "capacity for suffering, citizenship in the kingdom of ends" or, we might add, their common citizenship in a liberal democracy -- could also presumably ground requirements of equal distribution. They could do so if it could be shown that equal distribution is required for a society to respond appropriately to common citizenship or for citizens to relate to one another in ways that express the status they share.

It is natural to say of views like these that they are founded on the moral equality of persons or on the social or political equality of citizens. One objection to Frankfurt is that views which take one of these kinds of equality as fundamental, and which draw out its distributive implications, seem to merit the label 'egalitarian'. Indeed, they seem to me to merit it even if the kind of equality which is taken as fundamental is not said to require the equal distribution of income, wealth, opportunity or welfare. They are egalitarian because, even if they do not aim to equalize resources, they still aim to equalize people. It is only by construing 'egalitarianism' with unnecessary narrowness that Frankfurt can label himself an anti-egalitarian.

Frankfurt might respond that this objection misses his point. For the conclusion he wishes to defend is not about the extension of the label 'egalitarian.' It is that equality -- understood now as distributive equality, rather than as the moral, social or political equality of persons -- is not of fundamental moral importance. Views which take moral, social or political equality as fundamental do not deny that.

A further question is how Frankfurt's denial that equality is a fundamental value is connected to his sufficientarianism. I believe he derives the two from a common premise. That premise is, roughly, that we can determine the fundamental value which the distribution of resources should satisfy or realize -- and hence what distributive shares people are entitled to -- by determining what people evaluating their own resources should be concerned with receiving. Frankfurt claims that it is alienating and superficial (pp. 12 and 14) to compare one's share with others' because what others have is extrinsically related to one's own life (p. 60). Since concern with an equal share requires such comparisons, it is a mistake to concern oneself with getting an equal share. Frankfurt's conclusion that equality is not a fundamental distributive value then follows.

What is intrinsic to one's life are one's "individual capacities, . . . particular needs [and] best potentialities" (pp. 73-74). Since someone "wondering whether to be satisfied with the resources at his disposal" should take account of what is intrinsic rather than extrinsic to her life (p. 73), she should be concerned only with receiving sufficient "resources to provide for the satisfaction of [their] basic needs and . . . interests." (p. 74). This last claim, when conjoined with the common premise, implies sufficientarianism.

These two lines of reasoning can, I believe, be recovered from On Inequality, though Frankfurt never explicitly states what I call "the common premise". The problem with them is that the common premise is false. For

(i) people's only concern about their resources should be with whether they have enough to lead lives they regard as satisfying

is compatible with

(ii) respect for moral, social or political equality grounds entitlements to equal shares.

Someone objecting to the common premise on this ground would agree with Frankfurt that the value of distributive equality is derivative rather than fundamental since she thinks the fundamental value which distributions should realize is the moral, social or political equality of persons rather than the arithmetic equality of shares. But because she accepts (ii), she would not be sufficientarian. She would be committed to an implication of conjoining (i) with [or and] (ii): that it is possible people should not be concerned with getting what they are entitled to. But that implication is not as problematic as it might seem. For there is a possible states of affairs in which (i) and (ii) are satisfied because people deliberate about their lives secure in the knowledge that their entitlements are taken care of by what Rawls calls "background justice".[1]

Frankfurt could try to rebut the foregoing objection to the common premise by denying the possibility of (ii). That would not, however, be enough to salvage his common premise or his sufficientarianism. For suppose for the sake of argument that Rawlsians accept the possibility of (i), as I implied they might at the end of the previous paragraph. They deny (ii), as I am now imagining that Frankfurt would. But they still reject Frankfurt's common premise because they think that (i) is compatible with

(ii¢) respect for the moral or political equality of citizens grounds entitlements to shares earned under a basic structure satisfying the difference principle.

Like the objector who points to the compatibility of (i) and (ii), the Rawlsian joins Frankfurt in denying that distributive equality is fundamental. Unlike that objector and like Frankfurt, she rejects the possibility of (ii). But like that objector and unlike Frankfurt, the Rawlsian rejects sufficientarianism.

Though Frankfurt does not take up the Rawlsian alternative to sufficientarianism, "Equality and Respect" suggests how he might reply. I believe Frankfurt would agree with the Rawlsian on the fundamental importance of treating people respectfully when resources are distributed. But I also believe he would deny the relevance of (ii¢) because the kind of respect to which it refers, respect for moral or political equals as such, is not the kind of respect Frankfurt thinks is fundamental when distributional questions are at stake. What he takes to be fundamental is instead the kind of respectful treatment I said he distinguishes from equal treatment when he grants that the demands of respect and equality could coincide.

There, Frankfurt writes that "The most fundamental difference between equality and respect has to do with focus and intent. With regard to any interesting parameter . . . equality is merely a matter of each person's having the same as the others." (pp. 77-78)

Frankfurt says that someone is disrespected feels that "significant elements of his life count for nothing" (p. 86) and that "his nature is denied." (p. 87, emphasis added) These remarks suggest what Frankfurt thinks the "focus" of respect is. They suggest he thinks that when someone is treated with respect, the foci of that treatment are those features of her life that she regards as significant enough to be equated with her "nature", by which I take him to mean those features that she takes to be intrinsic to it and with which she identifies -- or better, with which she should identify. As we saw earlier, Frankfurt thinks that when the distribution of resources is at stake, what we ought to judge to be intrinsic to our lives are our "individual capacities, . . . particular needs [and] best potentialities." (pp. 73-74) Thus I read Frankfurt as claiming that the kind of respect which is relevant to the distribution of economic resources is respect for people in their particularity rather than respect for them as moral or political equals. That is why I believe he would respond to the Rawlsian by denying the significance of (ii¢).

This reply does not just enable Frankfurt to deflect the Rawlsian objection to the common premise. It also suggests his reasons for accepting it. According to the reply, respect is a response to those aspects of our lives which we should judge to be intrinsic or with which we should identify. But identification is not just a matter of assenting to descriptions of ourselves. It is a matter of according those aspects of ourselves what Frankfurt elsewhere calls "commanding authority" in our lives.[2] This authority makes them the source of reasons -- reasons to conduct ourselves in certain ways, to pursue certain projects and to develop certain talents. Acting on these reasons requires resources. And so if there are aspects of our lives with which we should identify, we should also be concerned with getting the resources we need to act on them. I've said that Frankfurt thinks when questions of distributive justice are at stake, it is fundamentally important that our well-founded judgments of intrinsicality receive a respectful response. I believe he thinks the same goes for our concern to get whatever resources we need to act on those judgments. And I believe he thinks that that concern receives a respectful response when we identify what people are entitled to with what they should be concerned to get, just as the common premise says we should.

If I have interpreted Frankfurt correctly, then his views seem liable to a number of difficulties.

First, the kind of respect that Frankfurt thinks is fundamentally important to the distribution of resources differs from two more familiar forms of respect that have been thought to have distributional implications. It is not responsive to -- and does not distribute in accordance with -- differences in accomplishment or excellence, and so differs from what we might call "Aristotelian respect". It is also not responsive to -- and does not distribute in accordance with -- a shared status which is highly abstract, and so it differs from the Rawlsian respect referred to in (ii¢). In its non-comparative character and its concern with particularity, it seems to me more closely to resemble the attitude that parents should take toward their children when they have to divide resources among them. In that case, it seems not to be better described as "care" than as "respect". Frankfurt might insist that the difference is merely verbal. But views of justice which are founded on respect have an appeal to which Frankfurt's account cannot lay claim if its roots really draw sustenance from other moral sources.

Moreover, parents can exercise care because they know a lot about their children. A sufficientarianism which takes care for people's actual capacities and concerns as fundamental would require the agents charged with satisfying it to gather far more information about people than they could or should. I have taken Frankfurt to say that people are entitled to what they would be concerned with receiving if they judged correctly about what is intrinsic to their lives or to what they ought reasonably to be concerned with receiving (see p. 48). The modal interpretation of his view avoids the informational problem, but it raises questions about just how economic entitlements are to be determined. Those are questions which a care-based view may well lack the conceptual resources to answer. If it does, then the egalitarianism expressed by (ii¢) will prove superior to it by default.

Finally, I have read Frankfurt as denying the significance of (ii¢), though he gives no reason for deeming the form of respect to which it refers irrelevant to the distribution of resources. Perhaps he denies the significance of (ii¢) because he denies its truth. And perhaps he denies the truth of (ii¢) because he thinks that living together as moral, social or political equals is consistent with everyone's having just what she needs to lead a life that she reasonably takes to be satisfying. But even if we suppose that the previous objection can be overcome and that it is possible to determine what distribution sufficientarianism demands, it remains the case that the lives people choose and find satisfying depends upon which opportunities are open to them, which of those opportunities they can seize and hence upon what resources are at their command. It is therefore possible that two people lead lives which they find equally satisfying ex post but make different choices about where to pursue satisfaction because their resources were unequal ex ante. According to sufficientarianism, all such differences are unexceptionable, provided the lives surpass some -- unspecified -- threshold of decency or richness. But since some such differences are surely incompatible with the kinds of equality to which (ii¢) refers, the reason I have supposed Frankfurt would give for denying (ii¢) is false and the Rawlsian's objection to sufficientarianism remains unanswered.

In On Inequality, Harry Frankfurt has once again shown himself to be a sensitive, humane and highly original philosopher. Anyone who is disturbed by the rise of inequality should grapple with what he has to say about why it is troubling. They will learn a great deal by doing so even if, in the end, they do not find his arguments persuasive


[1] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Harvard University Press, 1999), p. 268.

[2] Harry Frankfurt, "The Importance of What We Care About", Synthese 53, 2 (1982): 257-72, p. 258.