2016.02.31

J. David Velleman

Beyond Price: Essays on Birth and Death

J. David Velleman, Beyond Price: Essays on Birth and Death, Open Book, 2015, 232pp., free online, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783741670.

Reviewed by Margaret P. Battin and Brent M. Kious, University of Utah


In this collection of essays, dating from 1991 to 2012 and encompassing some of his best-known works (e.g. "Well-Being and Time") as well as lesser-known pieces, J. David Velleman examines the value of human life from several perspectives. He begins by considering when we should end our own lives ("Against the Right to Die, "A Right of Self-Termination?", "Beyond Price"), moves on to explore what we owe to the unborn ("Family History", "Persons in Prospect"), next discusses what makes a life good ("Well-Being and Time"), and concludes with an examination of what, if anything, makes the end of a life bad ("So It Goes", "Dying") The final essay ("The Rights to a Life") merges several themes. In this way, the volume appears to come full circle, though a closer reading suggests that Velleman has really presented us with a sort of Mobius strip: he may not end on the same side of things as where he began.

The volume as a whole is, by turns, heartfelt, personal, vexing, and occasionally a bit obscure. Velleman is at his best when his writing is at its most personal, when he is making keen observations on his lived experience, and when he is grappling with issues nearer to applied ethics. Things go less well the further he strays from these anchors; the main deficit of the volume, as well as many of the individual essays, is that there is often a disconnect between Velleman's more structured arguments and the first-personal observations that seem to have prompted them. One feels, at times, astonished by his sensitivity to the complexity of human life, and at others astonished that he could seem so certain that he has started to unravel that complexity.

The book will be vexing to many because Velleman seems to advance a conservative position on a number of controversial social issues. He's largely against the right to die. He's against gamete donation -- that would include sperm banks, (presumably) surrogate pregnancy, and other forms of reproduction made possible by contemporary technology. He opposes terminal sedation. He even seems to think it bad for a fourteen-year-old girl to have a baby.

Much of Velleman's argument about assisted dying seems to be Kantian in character. Over the course of Chapters 2-4, he argues that policies permitting euthanasia or physician-assisted suicide on the basis of respect for autonomy would be wrong because they mistake autonomy's value. What Kant intended when he argued that we must respect autonomy is that our rational personhood must be treated as being of incomparable value -- that is, that there is nothing against which it should be traded. But in debates about euthanasia "dignity" often becomes synonymous with physical ability, or independence, or youth, and the decision to end one's life prematurely thus involves balancing the value of one's rational nature against the discomforts and inconveniences of a physically disabled existence. This, in Velleman's view, gets things backwards. Indeed, the only case in which he thinks aid-in-dying could be appropriate are those cases where one's integrity as a rational agent is threatened (an issue also raised by Kant) and ending one's existence becomes a way of preserving that integrity -- in something like the way burning a flag can be a way of showing it respect. It's worth mentioning, however, that it's really not clear why the incomparable value of our rational nature would dictate ending one's life when one's rationality was threatened as opposed to trying to preserve it for as long as possible. Nor does Velleman explain whether threats to our dignity as rational persons would mandate that we end our lives early or merely give us the option -- though the former would seem more consistent with his stance.

Someone not already given to a Kantian way of thinking might regard this sort of argument as merely assertive and hence unpersuasive. Sure, our rationality is a good thing, but is it the greatest good, and is it really incomparable to other values? Velleman obviously alludes to Kant's arguments to that effect but does not rehearse them in this volume or offer any complementary arguments. He doesn't address the hardest and most clinically relevant test cases, for instance the threat of Alzheimer's Disease, a rationality-defeating illness that would have given Velleman a real challenge. His remarks about love might seem to fill this gap, but they still start with the assumption that the most important thing about human beings is their rational nature. Thus, those who find themselves pulled in by Velleman's personal musings may well find themselves pushed away when he proceeds on assumptions they are not willing to accept.

The second movement -- comprising Chapters 5 and 6 -- examines our obligations to future generations. Here, too, Velleman shines with sensitivity to the diversity of human experiences and the complexity of the human predicament. He seems, for example, precisely right when he observes that there is no reason to think our judgments about the value of a potential life cannot be painfully conflicting: that we could think both that it is wrong to bring a child into existence knowing he will be severely disadvantaged, and that once that child exists, his life is something to be nurtured and cherished. Likewise, in his moving, historically resonant essays on family history, Velleman draws on the importance in his own experience of knowing who his grandfather and his great-grandfather were, what they were like, what they faced in escaping persecution, who in the deepest sense they were. This is used as an argument against genetic donation, since a person conceived by artificial insemination or via in vitro fertilization may be unable to know their (male-lineage) ancestors or family histories. But that such knowledge might not be possible is hardly the overwhelming argument against these practices that Velleman takes it to be. At worst, not being able to fill in a sense of self via knowledge of one's ancestors may be only a slight disadvantage, if at all.

Countering Velleman's penchant for argument from personal intuition, one of us (MPB) did know her grandfather and her great-grandfather, and agrees with Velleman that what she knows of them does contribute to her sense of self, but that they contribute in a very modest way; she does not imagine that her life would be blighted if she did not know where that line of gametes had come from at all. Obviously, other readers can test their own self-insights about whether knowing or not knowing who their forebears were shapes their conceptions of themselves. Thus if ancestral knowledge is not an overriding good, why all the fuss? Moreover, Velleman largely ignores the possibility that in some cases knowing one's biological relatives can be damning; if one hails from a lineage poisoned by malfeasance and poor character, one might sometimes be better off avoiding the self-doubt and the self-loathing that attaches to it.

The final movements of the book deal with the value of life and the harm of death. Again, Velleman's attention to his personal experiences, and his willingness to share those experiences, often makes for compelling reading. For example, Velleman confesses his fear of death, his lifelong focus on death, his conception of death as what should be a culminative event, and evolves a view about death out of those reflections. There's a powerful personal, emotional and conceptual claim here; there's a demanding normative claim here; and there's of course a focus of interest. Heady stuff, to be sure.

But there are two problems with individual perceptions and deep personal intuitions as the basis for philosophical theorizing. First, of course, they can't be generalized to all people's personal intuitions: these are Velleman's intuitions, not everybody's. In the latter essays, for example, Velleman examines the relevance of his view about the narrative value of a life (articulated in "Well-Being and Time") to how we should think about our own deaths. He seems to think that the best -- and perhaps the only -- way to evaluate a life is as a narrative arc (rather than via the sum of momentary well-being). As a result, he claims, dying per se is not a tragedy, at least if it can be seen as the conclusion to a life well-lived; indeed, in some cases, not dying would be bad, since one would then be leading a life-story without a conclusion. Second, Velleman expresses wishes for his own eventual dying -- for example, that he will be conscious, self-aware, able to experience "my death." It's a brave, open-eyed stance. But both of these stances involve the same kind of misstep. In both cases, Velleman seems to take a personal sentiment and carry it to implausible extremes. In the first case, some of us, we might guess, would be inclined to say "the idea of living out a nice narrative arc is indeed appealing, but I'd still rather have immortality (or at least go on for as long as possible)." And in the latter case, Velleman simply doesn't acknowledge that at least some people say they'd rather not know when death is coming; they'd rather just go to sleep and not wake up; the romantic, existentialist-flavored notion of my death is not for them. Everybody dies; but, we might assume, some would rather not have to face it.

Though it is probably to be expected from a book of philosophy, the biggest failing of the book is that Velleman frequently, having sensitively picked out a feature of the human condition, places too much faith in the power of an argument to improve it. Consider his remarks on human suffering in "So It Goes". There he suggests that suffering is due to our persistent belief in an enduring self, and then, in an extended exploration of the metaphysics of time and personal identity, arrives at the conclusion that it does not make sense to think of ourselves as enduring (as opposed to perduring). From this he draws the conclusion that we should feel some consolation about our own deaths (and indeed, most other bad things that happen to us). Problem solved? No, for this is cold comfort: his arguments are so remote from the experiences they address that it is almost impossible to countenance them. One's credence in Velleman's premises is miniscule relative to one's antecedent conviction that suffering is real and that the end of one's life is a harm.

Still, it is always interesting to be afforded the opportunity to track how the views of a well-known philosopher evolve over time. Despite the consistent preoccupations with death and the value of life manifest in this book, Velleman's views do indeed seem to change. For instance, his later view that much of the value in a human life is a matter of narrative arc, and his earlier view that the value of a human life is in its rational nature, seem at odds. Likewise, it is hard to reconcile his view that the goodness of a life is best understood as a second-order, irreducible, narrative value with the view that we should reject the idea of the enduring person -- since the enduring person seems to be the narrative's protagonist. But perhaps that is the ultimate lesson Velleman wishes us to draw -- alluded to early on, and stated clearly near the end ("Dying"): that there is no one right way to think about these issues, and so likewise no one right way to feel about them.

Velleman's contribution to contemporary thought has been to explore and express his own experiences in a way that invites others to challenging philosophical reflection. On the down side, after starting from these experiences, he often strays too far from them, wandering deep into the metaphysical woods. And he expects his readers to follow, asking us to cast aside our own sense of the moral true north in favor of the wayward compass he offers us. But on the up side, the essays have enormous strengths. They are surprisingly inventive and personal. They're adventuresome. They're interesting. They explore important philosophical and social issues. They represent a career-long set of interests. And the creative reasoning they exhibit in the profound way they plumb their author's own intuitions and personal observations gives these essays both their life and their limitations.