2016.02.34

Tatjana Višak and Robert Garner (eds.)

The Ethics of Killing Animals

Tatjana Višak and Robert Garner (eds.), The Ethics of Killing Animals, Oxford University Press, 2015, 252pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199396085.

Reviewed by Jeff Sebo, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


In this excellent new volume, Tatjana Višak and Robert Garner bring together twelve essays on the ethics of killing animals, their introduction, and an afterword by Peter Singer. With the exception of a (very welcome) reprinted article by Christine M. Korsgaard, all of the material is new, and serves as a wonderful introduction to the topic and contribution to the literature.

The collection has three parts: value theory, moral theory, and political theory. The central question of Part I is: what, if anything, is the value of life and death for nonhuman animals? Can nonhuman animals benefit from coming into existence, or be harmed by going out of existence (or vice versa)? This requires us to answer many other questions, including: Do we need to care about the future or experience psychological continuity across time in order to be harmed by death? Can we compare the value of existence with the value of non-existence, and do we need to do so in order to make sense of the idea of lives worth living? In Chapter 1, T. J. Kasperbauer and Peter Sandøe provide a useful primer on many of these issues by chronicling our changing conceptions of animal welfare during the twentieth century, focusing on our shift away from narrow hedonism, which considers only negative mental states, towards wide hedonism, which considers positive as well as negative mental states, and perfectionism, which considers whether or not a particular life is "natural". They then argue that this trend is good, since wide hedonism and/or perfectionism, unlike narrow hedonism, can vindicate the plausible idea that killing animals is a welfare issue.

The next two chapters feature a debate between Christopher Belshaw and Ben Bradley about such topics as (a) whether or not one must have categorical desires (i.e. desires that are not conditional on being alive) in order to be harmed by death (Belshaw argues yes, Bradley argues no) and (b) whether or not animals such as cows have categorical desires (Belshaw argues no, Bradley argues yes). Jeff McMahan then asks whether suffering is worse than death for nonhuman animals. He argues that we can generate plausible answers if we combine (a) his Time-Relative Interest Account of the harm of death, which considers how much future good life death deprives one of and how psychologically connected one would have been with these future selves, with (b) Asymmetry, which, in its weak form, holds that we have stronger reason not to bring about bad lives and futures than we have to bring about good lives and futures. Next, Steven Luper argues for the interesting -- though only, I think, indirectly relevant to the topic at hand -- thesis that either we are essentially animals or no animals have interests, and he also argues that the former disjunct is at least as plausible as the latter. Finally, Nils Holtug presents a strong defense of the Value Existence View, which holds that one can benefit from coming into existence, by arguing that it is possible to compare existence with non-existence. All in all, Part I, while perhaps longer relative to the other two parts than it needs to be, sets the stage for the rest of the book very well.

Part II (with four chapters) is about moral theory. Supposing that animals are harmed by death, does it follow that we have a moral duty not to kill them? The authors ask these questions from utilitarian and Kantian perspectives. With respect to utilitarianism, Višak and Shelly Kagan both ask if utilitarians should follow Singer in thinking that "mere animals," i.e. animals with no future-directed interests, are "replaceable," i.e. that if we painlessly kill one "mere animal" and then replace them with another, then the bad that we do by killing the first will be compensated for by the good that we do by creating the second (p. 136). Višak argues that utilitarians can and should reject replaceability since they can and should reject impersonal utilitarianism, from which replaceability follows, in favor of a "saturating-counterpart person-affecting utilitarianism," which holds that we should maximize utility on a person-affecting view about welfare, from which replaceability does not follow (p. 122). In contrast, Kagan argues that utilitarians should accept replaceability, in part because the "total view" about the ethics of creating new beings, which "counts the interests of everyone who will or might exist . . . symmetrically, taking into account both pleasure and pain" (p. 142), is more plausible than other options all things considered (even though "replaceability for mere animals does seem to follow," p. 145), and in part because preference utilitarians can accept replaceability for "mere animals" without accepting it for persons. Overall, these chapters are both very interesting and together present a nice pair of contrasting positions.

As for Kantianism, Korsgaard and Frederike Kaldewaij both ask if Kantians should follow Kant in denying that "nonrational animals" are ends in themselves and members of the Kingdom of Ends (p. 155). Korsgaard focuses on Kant himself, arguing that his moral and political philosophy supports rather than undermines moral and legal rights for animals. Specifically, she argues for moral rights for animals on the grounds that, on her reading of Kant, when we treat the things that matter to us as mattering absolutely, we commit ourselves to treating the things that matter to everyone, including nonrational animals, as mattering absolutely. And she argues for legal rights for animals on the grounds that, on her reading of Kant, the function of the law is to protect the right for everyone, including nonrational animals, to "be where he or she is" and "to take what he or she needs in order to live" (p. 171). Kaldewaij focuses on Kantian constructivism, according to which reasons are products of a procedure of construction. Specifically, she argues that if, as per constructivist arguments from agency, our individual practical standpoint commits us to valuing the interests of rational agents, then it commits us to valuing the interests of certain nonrational animals as well. And she argues that if, as per constructivist arguments from interaction, our shared practical standpoint commits us to considering the interests of rational agents, then it commits us to considering the interests of certain nonrational animals as well. I really enjoyed both of these chapters, though I should note that, in light of how influential Korsgaard is in the literature that Kaldewaij discusses, they overlap perhaps a bit more than the editors intended.

Part III, the shortest (with two chapters), is about political theory. Supposing that animals are harmed by death, does it follow that we (should) have a political duty not to kill them? Alasdair Cochrane reviews three approaches to grounding political rights for animals and argues that each has costs and benefits. He then develops a "two-tiered interest-based approach" to animal rights -- with an abstract tier that tells us which rights animals should have all else equal, and a concrete tier that tells us which rights animals should have all things considered -- and he argues that this approach is more plausible than the other three (p. 210). Garner closes by arguing that the literature on the ethics of killing animals focuses too much on ideal theory, which tells us which ideals to accept in theory, and not enough on non-ideal theory, which tells us which ideals to advocate for in practice. He then argues, following Rawls, that if we want to get from the real to the ideal in practice, we should advocate for a compromise between the two -- which in this case means focusing on animal suffering rather than on animal death, since (a) advocacy around animal suffering is more likely to get support than advocacy around animal death, and (b) animal suffering is worse than animal death, and therefore should be our priority. This is a striking note to end the book on -- I think that Garner intends for this discussion to represent a turning point in the literature, and in some respects I think that it should (I will say more about this below).

Overall, this volume has a remarkably consistent high quality for an edited collection, as well as several genuinely standout pieces. Personal favorites include the Bradley, Holtug, Kagan, Korsgaard, and Cochrane chapters, but many others are terrific as well. I also really appreciate how much the authors engage in debate with each other -- for example about whether or not categorical desires are necessary for death to be a harm, whether or not we can compare existence with non-existence, and whether or not utilitarians should accept replaceability -- as well as how much they do not engage in debate with each other. For example, nobody challenges the idea that vertebrates are sentient or that we have at least a prima facie moral duty not to cause sentient beings to suffer. This already means that everyone here is morally opposed to industrial animal agriculture on animal welfare grounds -- as they should be. Moreover, only one of the authors, Belshaw, argues that animals such as cows are not harmed by death in a way that matters morally. And yet even Belshaw grants that animals such as "elephants, chimpanzees, some birds and cetaceans" might "have a grasp of the future relevantly similar to ours, such that death is bad for them, and in the way that matters" (p. 39). Hence none of the authors argues that all and only humans (or moral agents) are harmed by death in a way that matters morally. Some readers might think that this consensus indicates editorial bias. I think, instead, that it indicates philosophical progress, and a welcome editorial refusal to give equal space to perspectives that, at this point, we should all be happy to be moving on from.

I feel somewhat ambivalent about another, related feature of the book, however, which is: its strong emphasis on the ethics of painlessly killing "mere animals" all else equal. Of course, I appreciate why Višak and Garner make this choice. This is an important issue, and you can only do so much in twelve chapters. I also appreciate how many of the authors explain what their focus will be and why, and how some, such as Cochrane and Garner, consider other issues as well. Still, there are many other important issues which this narrow focus leaves at the margins. For example, what are the boundaries of sentience and agency in the world, and how should we think about the ethics of killing animals in cases of uncertainty about sentience or agency? Also, what is the value of seeing animals as fellow creatures, and how does the act of killing them for our own benefit affect our ability to see them that way? Similarly, there are many other moral frameworks that this narrow focus marginalizes as well, including critical theory, virtue theory, and sophisticated consequentialism. Again, I fully understand that a broader focus would have had costs as well as benefits, but I personally think that the benefits of at least a bit more breadth would have outweighed the costs. (If nothing else, an entry on critical theory might have reminded the editors and most of the authors not to refer to nonhuman animals as 'it' a full 25 years after Carol Adams published The Sexual Politics of Meat -- a small but telling sign of how marginalized work on objectification still is in this area, despite its direct relevance to the topic at hand.)

This brings me back to Garner's chapter on ideal and non-ideal theory in animal ethics. As I indicated above, I agree with Garner that we need more non-ideal theory in this area, and I think that his discussion about the value of compromise in politics, activism, and advocacy captures one important part of what this "non-ideal theory turn" will involve. But I also think that we can and should take this idea farther than he does, in two ways. Let me explain.

First, as I mentioned above, Garner writes that if we want to get from the real to the ideal, then we should advocate for a compromise between the two, which in this case means focusing on animal suffering rather than on animal death (p. 223-7). But while I agree that we need to be pragmatic here, I also think that pragmatism requires more than advocating for a compromise between the real and the ideal. Why? Because if the history of social movements is any guide, then we will not bring about real change for animals by advocating for a single, unified ideal at all. Instead, what will bring about real change for animals is a complex, pluralistic movement in which different people advocate for different, seemingly incompatible ideals in different situations. For example, yes, sometimes pragmatism might require focusing on animal suffering so that we can bring about incremental change in the short term (as happens, for example, when Humane League advocates promote the benefits of cage-free eggs and Meatless Mondays). But other times it might require focusing on animal death so that we can challenge speciesism and pave the way for radical change in the long run (as happens, for example, when Direct Action Everywhere activists protest production and consumption of animal products in general). Indeed, we might even think that these approaches are mutually reinforcing since radical advocacy shifts the center of debate and paves the way for moderate reform, and moderate reform shifts the goalposts and paves the way for radical change. To be clear, I am not saying that we should be focusing on animal death more (or less) than we currently are. I am rather only saying that, if we want to know what we should be advocating for, then we need to treat this as an open, empirical question; we need to consult a wide range of experts in our attempts to answer it (including advocates who, contrary to what Garner writes on p. 215, do engage rigorously with political strategy); we need to keep in mind that different answers might apply for different people in different situations; and we need to keep in mind that a full answer will take into account not only the short-term, individual impacts of our individual behavior but also the long-term, structural impacts of our collective behavior.

Second, as I also mentioned above, Garner writes that the role of ideal theory is to tell us which ideals to accept in theory and the role of non-ideal theory is to tell us which ideals to advocate for in practice (p. 215-23). But while I agree that we need non-ideal theory to know what to advocate for in practice, I also think that we need it to know what to accept in theory. Why? Because as Charles Mills (2005) argues, the simple, idealized cases that we consider for the most part in ideal theory abstract away from the social, political, and economic forces that shape our beliefs, values, and behaviors in the real world. They therefore risk distorting our thinking not only about which ideals to advocate for in practice but also about which ideals to accept in theory -- for example they risk directing our attention away from certain questions and towards others, directing our attention away from certain answers and towards others, and concealing the degree to which our epistemic standpoint shapes our intuitions about these issues. This amplifies my point about the narrow focus in this volume, since it implies that a broader focus is not only desirable but essential. That is, it implies that if we want to think clearly about whether or not animals should have a right to life (in theory as well as in practice), then we need to be doing ideal and non-ideal theory together all along the way, weaving discussion of simple cases that help us to clarify our concepts together with discussion of complex cases that help us to identify which questions to ask, which answers to consider, and which biases to keep in mind as we do (including and especially our own tendency to treat nonhuman animals as objects and to discount their social and psychological complexity in the course of doing so). Had Višak and Garner taken this approach, they could have shown what it means to combine ideal and non-ideal theory in this area in a rigorous and systematic way. As it stands, this book is still very good at what it does, but what it does is only a small and idealized -- and, therefore, potentially distorting if considered in isolation -- part of what we should be doing overall in this area.

Yet even though I think that Garner does not fully capture what a "non-ideal theory turn" will involve for the ethics of killing animals, I ultimately think his chapter is an important contribution to an excellent collection. I highly recommend this book for research as well as teaching. I would go so far as to call it essential for people working on animal ethics.

ACKNOWLEDGEMENTS

Thanks to Nicolas Delon, David Frank, Barry Maguire, Maryse Mitchell-Brody, and Steven Swartzer for helpful discussion.

REEFERENCES

Carol Adams, The Sexual Politics of Meat (Continuum Books, 1990).

Charles Mills, "'Ideal Theory' as Ideology," Hypatia 20:3 (2005), pp. 165-183.