Martin Heidegger


Martin Heidegger, Hegel, Joseph Arel and Niels Feuerhahn (trs.), Indiana University Press, 2015, 145pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253017574.

Reviewed by Jeffrey L. Powell, Marshall University

Hegel, by Martin Heidegger, was the second text to appear from division three of the Heidegger Gesamtausgabe, the first of which was Contributions to Philosophy (of the Event). The volume was originally published in German in 1993, four years after the first edition of the Contributions. Since that time, a total of sixteen volumes have appeared from division three with only two more remaining to be published; of those sixteen volumes, eight have been translated, including the present volume. All of these volumes place special demands on the translators, demands that have been met in various ways and with varying degrees of success. All told, Joseph Arel and Niels Feuerhahn have produced a very readable translation from a volume that can be, like all of the division three volumes, difficult, to say the least. Indeed the English-speaking world should be thankful to Arel and Feuerhahn for their work in making this volume available. These manuscripts from the middle 1930s to the early-mid 1940s are notoriously difficult to translate. This is due not just to the work Heidegger exercises on the German language, but also to the fragmentary nature of some of these writings, and this is especially the case here in the first part of this two-part volume. Nevertheless, attention should be directed to some of the translation decisions.

Part One is from the years 1938-39 and 1941, and is concerned with Hegel's Logic. It consists of five chapters, with chapter 1 comprising over half of the entire first part. Part Two concerns Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit and its different locations within the larger Hegelian system. Those already familiar with Heidegger's other treatments of Hegel's Phenomenology (the 1930-31 lecture-course, "Hegel's Concept of Experience," and "Hegel and the Greeks") will find much here that is familiar. I will thus focus my remarks on Part One and what I view as the essential analysis in relation to which the other analyses are enacted.

Regarding the translation, the most glaring decision concerns the translation of the German Anfang and Beginn. Arel and Feuerhahn have chosen to render the former as "beginning" and the latter as "inception." There is no as yet established custom for translating the two terms, although the adjective anfänglich is more often than not rendered as "inceptual." Richard Rojcewicz tends to translate the German Beginn with "start" and Anfang, like Arel and Feuerhahn, with "beginning." Both Hölderlin lecture-courses and The History of Beyng have translated Anfang with "commencement" and Beginn with "begin." I am not aware of any existing translation that renders Beginn with "inception." In either case, Anfang must be aligned with what Heidegger thinks as the other beginning and Beginn with the first beginning or metaphysics.

Abbau has been translated throughout with "dismantling." I would generally prefer "deconstruction" here as it appears that Heidegger has at this point fully appropriated what he had earlier thought underDestruktion and had determined in section 6 of GA24: "Construction in philosophy is necessarily destruction [Destruktion], that is to say, a consummated deconstruction [Abbau] of traditional concepts carried out in a historical recursion to the tradition."[1]

The er prefix is confounding to all Heidegger translators, and this period of Heidegger is especially difficult in this regard. There is certainly no solution to this difficulty that would satisfy its every appearance. Drawing again from The History of Beyng, the er has been translated with attention to its sense as originary opening. Thus sometimes Erreignung and on all occasions Er-eignung are translated as "the opening of appropriation." In my opinion, this would be equally warranted in §21 of chapter 1 of Part One of Hegel with the German Er-springung. Arel and Feuerhahn have translated this with "leaping-attainment," but they seem to have done so with full awareness of the problematic nature of that choice. In this particular case, there is ample reason to provide that alternative "leaping into the open" or even "opening leap" as Heidegger is in the midst of a discussion of the open that is at play in the anticipation of the philosophical presupposition where the presupposing would require a transformation of Dasein through this very leap. Heidegger:

Dasein not as something present-at-hand, merely ὑποχείμενον, that would become present-at-hand simply through a regressive inquiry [to presuppositions], but instead: [as] opening-leap [Er-springung] that transforms human being [Menschwesen], and this one only in and from the inquiry of what is most questionworthy (28).

The editor of the German edition, Ingrid Schüßler, remarks that the "two treatises belong together both in terms of the time of their composition and in terms of their content" (115). Indeed both manuscripts were composed between 1938 and 1942, and both were believed to be prepared for the purpose of oral presentation. Both manuscripts treat Hegel, of course, but each concerns a different Hegel, the first treating the Logic (to which Heidegger will return later in his career), and the second the Phenomenology. Furthermore, the approach of both manuscripts are similar in that they attempt "to occupy a more originary standpoint, one that does not intrude from the outside" (5) on the text of Hegel, as Heidegger puts it in the first part. However, if the expectation is to encounter two similar manifestations of this approach, one will be greatly deceived. While both parts remain strictly focused on the respective text at hand, the first is far more in sync with the concerns and mode of presentation of the private manuscripts from division three of the Gesamtausgabe. As both the editor and the translators note, the texts of the first part share a fragmentary style of presentation as if this were merely accidental and perhaps due to their esoteric nature as notes. However, because all the so-called private manuscripts share this style, I wonder if it is not time to question the commonly held belief about the accidental nature of this style? Might it be that what separates the different manifestations of the two parts of this text is endemic to what Heidgger is trying to accomplished in each part? Further, might it not be the case that what is essential in Heidegger's investigation of Hegel is different in these two parts is itself what leads to the differing manifestations? That is, might it be that an investigation into the principle of negativity, which occupies the first part, is what leads the investigation in a different direction, a direction more essential than one offered by the investigation of consciousness, which occupies the second part?

It is not as if the first part concerning Hegel's Logic consists entirely of the so-called accidental fragments, but this  fragmentation only occurs when the analysis reaches a certain point for which the Hegelian text cannot itself account. I will now present the contours of that analysis up to the point where the Hegelian text fails. Part One, "Negativity: A Confrontation with Hegel Approached from Negativity,"[2] consists of five chapters of varying lengths. All five are concerned with Hegel's Science of Logic, with the exception of chapters III and IV. The latter two, while still focused on negativity, are more clearly positioned within the series of private manuscripts of the late 1930s to early 1940s. Chapter III (pp. 34-35) concerns the ontological difference, and chapter IV (pp. 36-39) concerns the clearing, the abyss, and nothing. As already indicated, it is not as if these concerns are irrelevant to Hegel, just that Heidegger's discussion is not as tailored to the text of Hegel as are the other chapters.

Heidegger begins his analysis by first establishing that the "basic determination of Hegel's philosophy . . . is negativity" (5-6). Once this has been established, he then continues by identifying three programmatic questions for the analysis: (1) clarifying the value of this Auseinandersetzung with Hegel, which has to do with the historical nature of the inquiry, historical in the unstated sense it was given by Nietzsche's determination of the "untimely" in his "On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life" (one should recall that Heidegger conducted a seminar on this very topic during the Winter semester of 1938-39 that is now published as GA46 and is due to appear in English translation with Indiana University Press later this year); 2) a clarification of Hegel's conceptual language, in particular the thought of being as actuality; and 3) a characterization of the standpoint (consciousness) and principle (the commencement [Anfang] of thinking) of Hegel's philosophy.

This is then followed by the listing of a series of seventeen numbered concerns related to other texts of Heidegger's in relation to Hegel. It is clear that these concerns are grounded, not simply in what Heidegger had written on Hegel, but also in the text of Hegel's Logic, in particular with regard to the very beginning of the Logic. Now, when Heidegger reaches his fourth concern, a shift occurs that simultaneously proceeds in two directions: 1) a continued orientation towards or from the Logic; and 2) an equal orientation towards or from what is now known as beyng-historical thinking. Granting that negativity is the basic determination of Hegel's philosophy, then the significance of Heidegger's setting-apart, confrontation, or encounter (Auseinandersetzung) with Hegel will have to do with accounting for the source or ground of Hegelian negativity. According to Heidegger, this source is as follows:

"Negativity" is the "energy" of unconditioned thinking because it has from the very beginning [Anfang] already surrendered everything that is negative and not-like [Nichthafte]. The question of the origin of "negativity" is devoid of sense and ground. Negativity is what is questionless: negativity as the essence of subjectivity. Negativity as the negation of negation is grounded in the yes to unconditioned self-consciousness -- of absolute certainty as "truth" (i.e., beingness of beings). (11)

This is Heidegger's rendering of the Hegelian view. However, according to Heidegger, this view is itself founded on a renunciation that fails to account for the "not" of negativity, fails to even identify the nothing all the while presenting itself as beginning with the absolute presuppositionless beginning, which "is" the nothing. Stated in the simplest of terms, what Hegel has failed to account for, what he has forgotten -- and what serves as the turning point in Part One of Hegel -- is the ground of that negation of negation, which Heidegger identifies as the ontological difference, the difference between being and beings. Thus Heidegger writes:

Absolute actuality (being in the broader sense) from the re-nunciation of the systematic (system-conforming) grounding of the difference between being and beings. This renunciation (already the consummation of neglect) out of the forgetfulness of this distinction (11).

It is for this reason that Heidegger will proceed to then view Hegel as the fulfillment of Cartesian metaphysics.

From this point on negativity in the Hegelian sense undergoes the Heideggerian deconstruction in a seeking of the ground of the ontological difference (see especially section 10 of Chapter I of Part One, pp. 17-19). More specifically, the establishment of the ontological difference between being and beings allows for the first time the simultaneous turning away from beings and turning towards being in its truth, i.e., towards

"The clearing of being -- indicated by a meditation [Besinnung] on the still uncomprehended unitary essence of thought in the sense of: I represent something as something in the light of being [rather than with regard to the positivity of something as the representation as self-consciousness]" (12).

Further, it is only through thinking being drawn into relation to being through the ontological difference that the clearing or truth of being is revealed and with it the source of negativity as the nothing. "The clearing as a-byss -- the nothing that is not null and naught [nichtig] but the proper burden, beyng itself" (12).[3] Once Heidegger identifies beyng with the abyss and the nothing, the setting-apart from Hegel in all its various forms will continue to exhibit how it is that Hegel fails to meet the demands of the nothing as nothing, i.e., the utter failure of determining the nothing even in the form of becoming (the first determination of the nothing from out of the equality of being and nothing in the Science of Logic). The same can be said of the nothing's twin, which is death. Regarding the latter, sounding like the Bataille of "Hegel, Death, and Sacrifice," Heidegger continues in the same vein as with the nothing:

Negativity as tearing and division is 'death' -- the absolute lord; and the 'life of absolute spirit' means nothing else than suffering and dealing with death. (But this 'death' can never become a serious threat; noκαταστροφή is possible, nor is any downfall and subversion [Sturz und Umsturz]; everything is contained and compensated. Everything is already unconditionally secured and accommodated) (19).

This view of Hegel is reinforced later in Part One when Heidegger writes that "Hegel's negativity is not a negativity because it never takes seriously the not and the nihilative -- it has already sublated the not into the 'yes'" (37). All of this would also explain, to my way of thinking, why Heidegger really does not venture beyond the very beginning of Hegel's Logic in this analysis, for it is at the very beginning, prior to the sublation of the purported difference between being and nothing into becoming, that Heidegger and Hegel approach what is most near.

I find Part One of Hegel a fascinating read. I suspect that not everyone, perhaps not even most, will agree with me on this score. It is full of insight regarding the as-structure in its relation to the nothing and being.  It also provides hints towards Heidegger's own invocation of negativity in the manuscripts of the 1930s, towards a more decisive situating of his own project in relation to Hegel, and towards many others insights that would be revealed through multiple readings. Finally, another insight is marked regarding the relation between the two parts of this text, the end of Part Two concerning the Phenomenology returns to the more fragmentary character of Part One albeit in the form of a forecasted "sketch" concerned with "Absolute Metaphysics" (104). As this "sketch" unfolds, Heidegger becomes drawn more and more towards Schelling, as well as more and more in the direction presented in Part One. In the penultimate section of Part Two, Heidegger then presents another one of his lists under the title "Confrontation [Auseinandersetzung] with Hegel" (110). The first item in the list is "Consciousness, therefore," which is then followed by seven additional items. The final item, as if joining the two parts of the entire text into some kind of comprehensible grid, reads: "8. Negativity and the truth of beings as being" (110). That is to say, negativity, real negativity, which is to say the nothing as the ground of the Phenomenology, being as the nothing that cannot be sublated.

[1] Martin Heidegger, The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, trans. Albert Hofstadter (Indiana University Press, 1982), 23, translation slightly altered.

[2] Another translation observation: "Confrontation" here is a translation of the well-known Auseinandersetzung. Due to the nature of what is at issue, negativity, as well as the nature of Heidegger's encounter with Hegel, "setting-apart" would seem to be the more likely English phrasing.

[3] I have slightly modified the translation here. The German reads "sondern eigentliche Schwergewicht, das Seyn selbst," which Arel and Feuerhahn render as "but the proper heavyweight, beyng itself."