2016.05.03

Ishtiyaque Haji

Luck's Mischief: Obligation and Blameworthiness on a Thread

Ishtiyaque Haji, Luck's Mischief: Obligation and Blameworthiness on a Thread, Oxford University Press, 2016, 358pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190260774.

Reviewed by E.J. Coffman, The University of Tennessee


Here's a relatively concise formal statement of Ishtiyaque Haji's central argument (HCA) in his impressive new book:[1]

(HCA-1) If you morally shouldn't perform an action A, then you're free with respect to A-ing (i.e., you can intentionally perform A and you can intentionally omit A).

(HCA-2) If you can neither stop believing you shouldn't A nor acquire motivation to A, then it's (‘false that you can intentionally A.

Therefore,

(HCA-3) If you can neither stop believing you shouldn't A nor acquire motivation to A, then it's false that you shouldn't A.

(HCA-4) For each of a wide range of actions that you believe you shouldn't perform, you can neither stop believing you shouldn't perform it nor acquire motivation to perform it.

Therefore,

(HCA-5) For each of a wide range of actions that you believe you shouldn't perform, it's false that you shouldn't perform it.

(HCA-6) You're blameworthy for an action only if you either (i) believe you shouldn't perform it or (ii) believe the action is "morally amiss" (p.159).

Therefore,

(HCA-7) For each of a wide range of actions that you believe you shouldn't perform, you're blameworthy for the action only if either (i) your culpability for it depends on your false belief that you shouldn't perform it or (ii) you believe the action to be morally amiss independently of believing you shouldn't perform it.

Arguably, if HCA-7 is true, then there's a lot less clear-eyed culpability (i.e., blameworthiness not sustained by false beliefs about actions' moral properties) than we're initially inclined to think. HCA-7 thus constitutes a species of skepticism about moral appraisability (p.262).

Chapter 1 introduces Haji's Central Argument and distinguishes it from more familiar skeptical arguments concerning moral appraisability and obligation. Chapters 2 and 3 defend HCA-1, Chapter 4 defends HCA-2 and HCA-4, and Chapter 5 defends HCA-6. Chapter 6 brings Haji's Central Argument to bear on (i) the connections among virtue, vice, obligation, and appraisability, as well as (ii) the ultimate aims of education. Chapter 7 develops arguments for 'Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism', the thesis that one is free with respect to A-ing at t only if it's proximally determined whether one A-s then -- i.e., only if it's false that the pre-t past and laws of nature are compatible with each of one's A-ing at t and one's omitting A then.

After exposing two internal problems with the overall view that Haji has arrived at by the end of the book, I'll scrutinize HCA-1 and HCA-6.

The first internal problem concerns Haji's endorsement of Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism, on the one hand, and his case for HCA-4, on the other. As Haji recognizes (pp.321-2), given that morally impermissible action is at least possible, Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism and HCA-1 jointly entail that your being free with respect to A-ing at t is compatible with its being proximally determined whether you A then. Accordingly, Haji must understand his argument in terms of "weak compatibilist alternatives" (p.322).

So understanding Haji's Central Argument engenders worries about both HCA-2 and HCA-4, though (given space constraints) I can discuss only the latter. Here's what Haji says on HCA-4's behalf:

support for [HCA-4] derives partly from . . . two theses which seem reasonable: (i) One cannot intentionally acquire a particular desire unless one has a conscious thought concerning that desire. (ii) The number of independent conscious thoughts any one of which one is in principle capable of having at one time is extremely large; and the maximum number of independent conscious thoughts all of which one is capable of having at one time is very small. In addition, . . . the way many of us conduct ourselves in day-to-day situations bears out [HCA-4]. Under mundane circumstances, it appears that very many of us would not betray confidences, not refrain from coming to the aid of a child who is drowning when we could easily save, not walk away from the nursery with a plant without making payment even though we could effortlessly do so, and so forth, and, moreover, we could not acquire the apt motivation to do or refrain from doing . . . such things. (pp.150-1; cf. pp.144-5)

Once we're understanding 'can intentionally A' so that one could have it in one's power to intentionally A at t even though A's non-occurrence then is entailed by the immediate past and laws of nature, neither of the considerations Haji presents on HCA-4's behalf seems plausible. Supposing we can intentionally do things that are inconsistent with the immediate past and laws of nature, it's not at all obvious that we can't simultaneously consider more than just a "very small" number of independent propositions. Moreover, assuming that we can do more than just add to the actual past in accordance with the laws of nature, it's not at all obvious that we can't betray confidences, omit rescuing drowning children, pilfer plants, or acquire motivation to do such things.

Assuming that impermissible action is at least possible, then, Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism and HCA-1 jointly undermine HCA-4. The best way for Haji to achieve coherence on this front, I think, would be to reject Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism. Haji presents two different arguments for Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism, what he calls the 'No Explanation Version' and the 'Pure Luck Version'. I'll focus on the former, since it seems to be the more novel and promising of the two arguments (cf. pp.333-4). I lack the space to reconstruct the whole argument here, but focusing on the following portion should suffice (see especially p.285):

(I) If Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism is false, then this scenario could obtain: you perform A while believing that you should A, but you could -- in exactly the same prior circumstances -- have subsequently performed B instead. (II) If your A-favoring reasons cause your A-ing in the presence of competing B-favoring reasons, then your A-favoring reasons were motivationally stronger than your B-favoring reasons. (III) So, if Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism is false, then this scenario could obtain: believing that you should A, you instead B while having motivationally stronger A-favoring reasons. (IV) If you B while believing that you should A, then your B-favoring reasons were motivationally stronger than your A-favoring reasons. (V) So, if Freedom/Indeterminism Incompatibilism is false, then (per impossibile) you could have B-favoring reasons that are motivationally both weaker and stronger than your A-favoring reasons.

Neither (II) nor (IV) seems plausible. As for (II), it seems possible that you act for reasons that weren't your motivationally strongest such states; but then, assuming (with the above argument's proponent) that acting for reasons is a causal phenomenon, it's possible that one's action be caused by reasons that weren't one's motivationally strongest such states (= ~II). As for (IV), it seems possible that one have equally strong motivation to act continently on an occasion when one instead acts akratically.

The second internal problem concerns Haji's endorsement of HCA-6, on the one hand, and his Frankfurt-inspired (1969) rejection of the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP), on the other. Haji relays David Palmer's (2013, pp.561-2; cf. Widerker 2000, p.192f.) argument that endorsing a substantive epistemic requirement on culpability like HCA-6 commits one to the Principle of Alternative Expectations (PAE), which in turn entails PAP. According to PAE, an "agent S is morally blameworthy for doing A only if in the circumstances it would be morally reasonable to expect S not to have done A" (Widerker 2000, p.192). Since it wouldn't be morally reasonable to expect one to omit an action that was unavoidable for one, PAE entails PAP (cf. Widerker 2000, p.192). Endorsing a substantive epistemic requirement on blameworthiness like HCA-6 commits one to PAE, Palmer argues, because PAE best explains why there are such requirements on blameworthiness.

Here's how PAE explains the (putative) truth of HCA-6 specifically (cf. p.187; Palmer 2013, pp.561-2):[2]

(2-1) If S is blameworthy for A-ing, then it's morally reasonable to expect S to refrain from A-ing.

(2-2) If it's morally reasonable to expect S to refrain from A-ing, then S believes (at least) that it's morally amiss for S to A.

Therefore,

(2-3) If S is blameworthy for A-ing, then S believes (at least) that it's morally amiss for S to A.

Haji tries to defend the coherence of endorsing HCA-6 while denying PAP by rejecting (2-2). The problem here is that none of Haji's four attempted counterexamples to (2-2) succeeds. Haji's attempted counterexamples fail (as he seems to worry they might -- see pp.189-90) because he misinterprets (2-2)'s antecedent as it's epistemically reasonable to believe that S won't A, whereas the correct interpretation of (2-2)'s antecedent is it'd be morally appropriate (for a morally competent observer who is aware of all the relevant facts) to demand that S not A (cf. Widerker 2000, p.193). I remain convinced that substantive epistemic requirements on culpability like HCA-6 commit their proponents to PAE.

The best way for Haji to achieve coherence on this front, I think, would be to retract his claim that Frankfurt-type cases impugn PAP. Here's Haji's favored Frankfurt-type case (note that the following example "incorporates determinism" and is therefore responsive to the "Dilemma Objection" [cf. Kane 1996, pp.142-44, 191-92] against those who deny PAP in light of Frankfurt-type cases):

Murder-2: . . . imagine that Black implants a mechanism in Pemba that initiates a certain deterministic process -- process p -- in Pemba's brain . . . there are two independent causal routes, one indeterministic (Pemba's ordinary practical reasoning) and the other deterministic (the sequence of events triggered by the fancy mechanism), . . . producing the very same event -- Pemba's deciding at t1 to [kill Rubens] . . . [Black's] mechanism works in lockstep with Pemba's indeterministic deliberative process -- process d -- between the time at which Pemba starts to deliberate about killing Rubens and time t1 at which he arrives at his deadly decision. As p unfolds, it "neutralizes" neural pathways whose activation is required to allow Pemba to deliberate . . . in ways different from the way in which he does and that would culminate in a decision not to kill Rubens (p.39).

Suppose Pemba would have been blameworthy for choosing to kill Rubens if he'd so chosen absent Black. Call the "manipulation-free" counterfactual scenario 'Murder-1'. Haji argues that Pemba is blameworthy for his choice in Murder-1 only if he's blameworthy for his choice in Murder-2. Haji's argument (p.40) for the indicated conditional depends on the following proposition:

If process p doesn't influence how Pemba's decision is caused by Pemba's indeterministic practical reasoning, then p's presence is irrelevant to the question whether Pemba is blameworthy.

The above proposition is false. By stipulation, p doesn't influence how Pemba's decision is caused by Pemba's reasoning. Since Pemba's choice was deterministically caused by p, Pemba didn't choose to kill Rubens on his own (or, "all by himself"). But Pemba is blameworthy for choosing to kill Rubens only if Pemba so chose on his own.[3] So, since Pemba's choice was deterministically caused by p, Pemba isn't blameworthy for so choosing. Hence, p's presence is indeed relevant to the question whether Pemba is blameworthy for his decision to kill Rubens.

Having exposed (and suggested solutions to) a couple of internal problems with the overall view Haji arrives at, I turn to the question whether Haji's Central Argument succeeds. First, a counterexample to HCA-6, one that Haji himself supplies:

Delivery: . . . I can fulfill the obligation to see to it that you receive a parcel by noon today in these ways: (a1) deliver it personally; (a2) have someone drop it to your home; (a3) call you to collect it . . . other obligations make me too busy permissibly to do any two of these things . . . imagine that (a1) is better than (a2) and (a2) is better than (a3) . . . if I call you, . . . I do something it is permissibly suboptimal for me to do. As I consider these options, I remember this incident: A month ago, you did me a small favor. You dropped off a present to a friend of mine in Buenos Aires while you were visiting that city . . . Although it is optional to return the favor I could provide you with a comparable benefit with little cost to myself. Despite being aware of the relevant rankings, and recalling the owed favor, I deliberately call you. I realize it would hardly have taken much for me to do significantly better (p.88).

I intuit (with Haji) that he's blameworthy for merely calling. If that's right, then Delivery -- described exactly as it is above -- impugns HCA-6: Haji is blameworthy for merely calling despite the fact that he hasn't (yet) formed the belief that calling is wrong or amiss (though Haji may well have justification to believe that calling is amiss, where this amounts to having evidence in virtue of which he's positioned to justifiedly believe that calling is amiss).

Haji subsequently adds to the above initial description of Delivery the further detail that he acted "in light of the . . . belief that [he] did something . . . amiss" (p.89). So Haji doesn't himself regard Delivery as a counterexample to HCA-6. My claim is that the initial description of Delivery above, which doesn't entail that Haji has already formed the belief that calling is amiss, elicits an intuition of culpability and thus impugns HCA-6. So HCA-6 must be weakened, which will in turn require a weakening of HCA-7. It's not at all obvious that the required replacement for HCA-7 will have surprising skeptical implications for the frequency of clear-eyed culpability. (In fact, I suspect it won't, but I lack the space to argue for that here.)

Even if we can avoid HCA-7, HCA-5 is a surprising skeptical claim in its own right. Does Haji's argument for HCA-5 succeed? I'll close by assessing the five main considerations that Haji adduces in support of HCA-1's most controversial element -- viz., the principle that one morally shouldn't A only if one can intentionally A ('Wrong Implies Can'). Here's the first consideration (p.21):

Surely, it is just as credible that . . . impermissibility require[s] control as it is that obligation requires control ['Ought Implies Can']. I cannot see what would sustain the view that it can be impermissible . . . , as of some time, for one to do something at that time, if one cannot, at that time, do it then.

But as Haji repeatedly points out (e.g., pp.7-8, 11-12, 237-40), Wrong Implies Can has some sharply counterintuitive consequences. If a loving parent simply can't bring herself to grossly mistreat her child, then (by Wrong Implies Can) it's not wrong for the parent to so mistreat her child, and she's not obligated to omit such mistreatment. Haji's claim to the contrary notwithstanding, Wrong Implies Can has much less initial plausibility than does Ought Implies Can (which Haji deems a "truism" [p.31]).

Examples like the one involving the loving parent who doesn't have it in her power to grossly mistreat her child also impugn the following argument that Haji offers in support of Wrong Implies Can (pp.32-3):

(I) If one morally shouldn't A, then it's objectively rationally impermissible for one to A. (II) If it's objectively rationally impermissible for one to A, then one can A. (III) Therefore, if one morally shouldn't A, then one can A.

If (II) is true, then a loving parent who just can't bring herself to grossly mistreat her child couldn't be such that she has most objective reason to omit such mistreatment. Surely such a parent could have most objective reason to omit such mistreatment.

Another of Haji's arguments for Wrong Implies Can appeals to this analysis of moral obligation:

(MO) A person, S, ought, as of t, to see to the occurrence of a state of affairs, p, if and only if p occurs in some world, w, accessible to S at t, and it is not the case that p's negation (not-p) occurs in any accessible world deontically as good as . . . w. (p.23)

Writes Haji (p.23):

According to MO, on each occasion, one ought to do the best one can. MO validates both "ought" implies "can" and "permissibility" implies "can"; if MO is true, these principles are true too. Once again, if "ought" and "permissibility" imply "can," with no good reason to believe otherwise, "wrong" implies "can" too.

Since having it in your power to bring about p doesn't entail that you also have it in your power to omit bringing about p (cf. p.21), MO's right-to-left conditional is actually inconsistent with Wrong Implies Can. It's hard to see, then, how MO could support Wrong Implies Can.

The fourth of Haji's five considerations on behalf of Wrong Implies Can employs this principle:

Impermissible/Obligation Possibility: If, at t, it is impermissible for S to do A at t, then, at t S can do something else, such as refraining from doing A, which it is obligatory for S to do at t. (p.25)

Writes Haji (p,26):

Assume, now (for reductio), that one denies that "impermissible" implies "can." However, one endorses the view that "ought" and "permissible" each implies "can". . . In addition, include among these "starting assumptions" the assumption that there are no genuine conflicts of obligation. Imagine a situation in which, as of t, you cannot do some heinous deed, A, at t. Given the starting assumptions, at t, it is neither obligatory nor permissible for you to do A at t, although it may be that at t, it is impermissible for you to do A at t. But then . . . Impermissible/Obligation Possibility [is] violated. Although (let's suppose), at t, it is impermissible for you to do A at t, it is false that, at t, you can do something else it is obligatory . . . for you to do then.

So far as I can see, it's consistent with all the relevant assumptions that you should and can omit A at t. But then there's no violation of Impermissible/Obligation Possibility here after all.

The following passage expresses Haji's fifth and final argument for Wrong Implies Can:

Assume that whenever one performs an action . . . one could not have done otherwise . . . Then as of any time, there is a single world accessible to one: the world in which one . . . acts . . . as one does. Suppose, in such a world, as of time, t, Joe A-s at t . . . But the obligatory is the deontically best . . . Regarding the primary moral status of A, there are three options. On the first option, on each occasion of . . . action, the world in which Joe . . . acts as he does is the deontically best world. But then, as of any time, if Joe does something -- no matter what -- at that time, it is obligatory for Joe to do it then. This latitudinarian view ['Unavoidable Implies Obligatory'] is surely implausible . . . On the second option, on each occasion of . . . action, the world in which Joe . . . acts as he does is a deontically nonbest world. But then, as of any time, if Joe does something -- no matter what -- at that time it is impermissible for Joe to do it then. This view ['Unavoidable Implies Wrong'] is just as unreasonable as the first . . . On the third option, on each occasion of . . . action, whatever Joe . . . does on this occasion is amoral for Joe . . . This option ['Unavoidable Implies Amoral'] is preferable to the other two. Given this consideration, one may venture that obligation, permissibility, and impermissibility require alternatives (p.34).

I assume that the above argument succeeds only if the following simpler one does too:

If an unavoidable action A has deontic value, then A is either obligatory or impermissible. Unavoidable actions are neither obligatory nor impermissible. So, unavoidable actions lack deontic value. So, an action is obligatory only if it's avoidable ('Ought Implies Can Omit'). But if Ought Implies Can Omit, then Wrong Implies Can.

Haji's claim to the contrary notwithstanding, Unavoidable Implies Wrong is much less plausible than Unavoidable Implies Obligatory: the latter is at least compatible with Ought Implies Can, whereas the former obviously isn't. So it seems we must choose between Unavoidable Implies Obligatory (UIO) and Unavoidable Implies Amoral (UIA).

UIO doesn't strike me as implausible. And I'm puzzled that Haji finds UIO implausible, since UIO is entailed by MO, which Haji deems "a powerful analysis . . . of the concept of obligation" (p.22). On the other hand, UIA has some sharply counterintuitive implications. Given UIA, a loving parent who simply doesn't have it in her power to omit protecting her child from impending danger isn't acting as she ought to when she protects her child. So UIA seems much less plausible than UIO. But then Haji's fifth and final argument for Wrong Implies Can falls alongside the others.

As I hope to have made clear, there's much in Luck's Mischief that deserves further reflection and discussion. Haji's new book is a rich, provocative, and illuminating investigation of numerous important issues at the intersection of ethics and action theory. I recommend it enthusiastically to specialists in those areas.

REFERENCES

Frankfurt, Harry. 1969. "Alternate Possibilities and Moral Responsibility." The Journal of Philosophy 66: 829-39.

Kane, Robert. 1996. The Significance of Free Will. Oxford University Press.

Mele, Alfred. 2006. Free Will and Luck. Oxford University Press.

Palmer, David. 2013. "Capes on the W-Defense." Philosophia 41: 555-66.

Widerker, David. 2000. "Frankfurt's Attack on the Principle of Alternative Possibilities: A Further Look." Philosophical Perspectives 14: 181-201.


[1] For a less formal summary statement, see pp.262-3.

[2] I preserve Haji's (p.187) labels for the pertinent argument's elements.

[3] Note that this claim isn't just a stylistic variant of PAP, since your choosing on your own to A is consistent with its being unavoidable for you that you'll choose to A (cf. Mele 2006, p.91).