2016.05.16

Herman Cappelen and Ernie Lepore

Liberating Content

Herman Cappelen and Ernie Lepore, Liberating Content, Oxford University Press, 2015, 303pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199641338.

Reviewed by Lenny Clapp, Northern Illinois University


This is a collection of fourteen papers written over the past two decades by Herman Cappelen and/or Ernie Lepore; ten of the papers were co-authored by Cappelen and Lepore, two were single-authored by Cappelen, and two were single-authored by Lepore. The book is divided into two distinct, though related, series: the "Alleged Connection" series and the "Varieties of Quotation" series. The ten papers in the "Alleged Connection" series all address, in one way or another, a puzzle that arises from two general observations concerning linguistic communication:

On the one hand, the contents we communicate to one another by uttering sentences are shaped in all kinds of ways by the context we are in when we speak -- e.g., by the topic of conversation, previous parts of the discourse, what is salient to the conversational participants, our shared background knowledge. It seems prima facie that the context sensitivity of communicated content is pervasive . . .

On the other hand, the contents we communicate to each other are easily moved across contexts. We tell others what someone told us, repeat a point we've made before, discuss the same question over and over again, remember what we were told -- in all these cases we seem to express the same contents in different contexts. (2)

The puzzle is then this: "how do we reconcile the apparent easiness of content sharing with the apparent ubiquity of context sensitivity?" (3). The four papers in the "Varieties of Quotation" series propose and defend an analysis of mixed quotation, the perplexing phenomenon whereby in reporting what someone has said a speaker (or writer) seemingly uses and simultaneously mentions a word or phrase appearing in quotation marks. Here I cannot comment on all the papers in the volume, nor even on all the papers in one of the two series. So I will only explain the general programme of reconciliation developed in the "Alleged Connection" series, and present what I think is a fundamental dilemma faced by this programme.

Many of the papers in the "Alleged Connection" series are critical of contextualist explanations of the apparent ubiquity of context sensitivity. Roughly put, contextualism purports to explain apparent context sensitivity semantically, by claiming that many words that are not obviously semantically context sensitive actually are such. (So characterized, theorists who endorse what Cappelen and Lepore dub radical and/or moderate pragmatics are not contextualists, but let it pass.) In the "Alleged Connection" series two lines of attack are developed against contextualism. The first is a methodological point that constitutes a criticism of the context shifting arguments (CSAs) contextualists invoke to support their view.[1] A CSA is built upon an instance of the apparent ubiquity of context sensitivity. To take a familiar example, consider two (simultaneous) utterances of 'It's raining'; suppose u1 is performed by Perry in sunny Palo Alto and u2 is performed by Travis in dreary London. Fill in some details about the contexts of utterance, and contextualists elicit the intuition that what u1 says is false and that what u2 says is true. But how are we to account for these intuitions, given that the same, apparently indexical-free (ignoring tense) sentence is uttered in u1 and u2? How are we to avoid the contradictory conclusion that the content of 'It's raining' is both true and false? The response of contextualism is to infer from the elicited intuitions concerning what is said by the utterances that the sentence 'It's raining' must contain a semantically context-sensitive word; e.g. perhaps 'to rain' designates not a property of times, but rather a two-place relation holding between times and locations, where the relevant time and location for an utterance are supplied by the context in which it occurs. Treating 'to rain' as a context-sensitive word designating such a two-place relation avoids the threated contradiction, since the location of u1 is distinct from the location of u2.

The fundamental methodological point Cappelen and Lepore develop against CSAs proffered in support of contextualism focuses upon "the assumption that the intuitions appealed to (about various utterances of S) are semantic; viz. they are the sorts of intuitions that a semantic theory must accommodate" (Context Shifting Arguments, 52). Indeed, Cappelen and Lepore declare that "a central driving motivation for us has been to establish that this view is false" (1). Thus the methodological point Cappelen and Lepore raise against contextualism is that the CSAs contextualists invoke to support their view are unsound. To infer from intuitions concerning what is said by utterances u1 and u2 to a conclusion concerning the semantics of the sentence 'It's raining' is to "conflate semantic content with speech act content" (1).

The other main line of attack Cappelen and Lepore pursue against contextualism develops the insight that though contextualism is tailor-made to account for the apparent ubiquity of context sensitivity, contextualists have "down played or straight out overlooked" (3) the seeming inter-contextual stability of content. In developing this second line of attack Cappelen and Lepore formulate and deploy -- with some repetition -- a battery of diagnostic tests that are alleged to show that many of the words contextualists have argued are semantically context sensitive are not really semantically context sensitive.

What is Cappelen and Lepore's positive strategy for reconciling the apparent ubiquity of context sensitivity and the seeming inter-contextual stability of content? Cappelen and Lepore explain that their "solution . . . was to advance a two-part programme: semantic minimalism and speech act pluralism. The idea was to let (semantic) minimalism account for shared content and (speech act) pluralism account for contextual variability" (3). Semantic minimalism is characterized by two theses:

  1. The only context-sensitive expressions are the completely obvious ones ('I', 'Here', 'now', 'that', etc.)
  2. all semantic context sensitivity is grammatically (i.e., syntactically or morphemically) triggered. (A Tall Tale, 94)

Semantic minimalism is alleged to account for the seeming inter-contextual stability of content because it implies that (ignoring tense) there are many indexical-free sentences, and different utterances of such semantically invariant sentences will encode the same minimal semantic contents. Thus semantic minimalism "guarantees a level of content that enables speakers whose conversational, perceptual, and cognitive environments are very different to agree and disagree" (Shared Content, 144).

What is speech act pluralism, and how is it supposed to account for the apparent ubiquity of context sensitivity? Though semantic minimalism dictates that any two (simultaneous) utterances of 'It's raining' encode the same minimal semantic content, this shared content does not exhaust the speech act content of, i.e. what is said by, the utterances. And according to Cappelen and Lepore "correctly determining what is said by an utterance often requires attending to non-interpretive, non-semantic considerations" (Insensitive Quantifiers, 37). Given the many differences between the contexts in which (simultaneous) utterances of 'It's raining' are produced (e.g. utterances are produced in different locations), it is to be expected that they do not all have identical speech-act contents. That is, though 'It's raining' semantically encodes just one minimal proposition and, as a consequence, every (simultaneous) utterance of this sentence has the same minimal semantic content, nonetheless distinct utterances of the sentences say different propositions. Applying this distinction between speech act content and semantic content to the recently rehearsed CSA suggests that in performing u1 in Palo Alto, Perry says that it's raining in Palo Alto, and he does not say that it is raining in London; and in performing u2 in London, Travis says that it is raining in London, and he does not say that it is raining in Palo Alto. Thus what utterances u1 and u2 say is distinct, and the apparent context sensitivity of 'It's raining' is explained by the pragmatic fact that, though every (simultaneous) utterance of 'It's raining' semantically encodes the same minimal content, different utterances of these sentence say different, i.e. truth-conditionally non-equivalent, contents.

The view that the same semantically-invariant sentence can be used in different contexts of utterance to say distinct speech-act contents is extremely plausible and widely endorsed. But Cappelen and Lepore maintain that speech act content is context sensitive in a more radical way. The more radical aspects of speech act pluralism are characterized by two theses:

  1. When you utter a sentence, S, in a context, C, you don't just say one thing (e.g. the semantic content of S in C). You say a potential infinity of propositions.
  2. The set of propositions you say by uttering S in C can vary between contexts of interpretation: relative to one interpreter, you might have said that p, but not so relative to another interpreter. (5) [2]

What is the evidence for this pluralism of speech-act content? Consider again Perry's utterance u1 of 'It's raining', which he performs in Palo Alto. In performing u1 what did Perry say? That it's raining in Palo Alto? That it's not sunny in Palo Alto? That California is getting some relief from the drought? That the weather is crummy for tennis? All of these intuitively distinct propositions can, it seems, be taken to be said by u1. Moreover, as is indicated by (ii) above, whether or not in uttering u1 Perry is understood as having said some or all of these distinct contents seems to depend as much on the contexts of interpreters as it does upon the context of Perry, the speaker. So, e.g., if Ernie is in New Jersey and engaged in a conversation about the drought in California, he would speak accurately if he reported u1 by uttering 'Perry said that California is getting some relief from the drought'. But Ernie would not speak accurately if he were to report u1 by uttering 'Perry said that the weather is crummy for tennis'. In contrast, if Herman is in Palo Alto and trying to back out of a tennis date, he would speak accurately if he reported u1 by uttering 'Perry said that the weather is crummy for tennis'. But he would not speak accurately if he were to report u1 by uttering 'Perry said that California is getting some relief from the drought'. And according to Cappelen and Lepore our intuitions concerning what is said by an utterance and our judgments concerning the accuracy of indirect reports about the utterance come to the same thing: "We don't see how to elicit intuitions about what-is-said by an utterance of sentence without appealing to intuitions about the accuracy of indirect reports" (On an Alleged Connection, 14).

The elicited intuitions that support speech act pluralism are, from a semantic point of view, somewhat puzzling. For consider two (simultaneous) utterances u3 and u4 of the indirect speech report

  1. Perry said that the weather is crummy for tennis.

Suppose u3 is performed by Ernie in his conversation about the drought, whereas u4 is uttered by Herman in his attempt to back out of a tennis date. The intuitions that support speech act pluralism have it that u3 is not accurate, but u4 is accurate. But how are we to account for this difference in accuracy, given that u3 and u4 are utterances of the very same apparently indexical-free (ignoring tense) sentence? Is what is said by (1) both accurate and inaccurate? The response of Cappelen and Lepore is to infer from the elicited intuitions concerning the accuracy of u3 and u4 that "our practice of reporting others treats what is said as a four-place relation between a sentence and its context of utterance and a reporting sentence and its context of utterance" (Insensitive Quantifiers, 38; An Abuse of Context, 174). Treating indirect speech reports as designating such a four-place relation thus avoids the threatened contradiction, since the contexts of u3 and u4 are distinct.

The papers collected here do not constitute a coherent position, nor even a pair of independently coherent positions. In and of itself, this is not a criticism; even in analytic philosophy one is allowed to change one's mind, especially over the course of twenty years. In fact, in the introduction Cappelen and Lepore themselves acknowledge two significant inconsistencies in the collected papers. First, they acknowledge that there is an inconsistency between the views developed in the two series. As Cappelen and Lepore put it, the views on quotation developed in the "Varieties of Quotation" series "didn't sit well with the simultaneous development of semantic minimalism in the other series of papers" (9). The reason these positions do not sit well together is that the view of quotation developed in the "Varieties of Quotation" series is a version of Davidson's paratactic account, according to which "quotation marks are, in effect, context-sensitive expressions" (9). This paratactic approach thus clearly conflicts with semantic minimalism's claim that "the only context-sensitive expressions are the completely obvious ones" (A Tall Tale, 94).[3]

The second inconsistency acknowledged by Cappelen and Lepore occurs within the "Alleged Connection" series. They concede that the foundational paper of this series, (viz. On an Alleged Connection between Indirect Speech and the Theory of Meaning) "can, and probably should, be read as arguing for the context sensitivity of 'said that'" (6). And indeed this contextualist analysis of 'said that' is certainly suggested by Cappelen and Lepore's claim that "our practice of reporting others treats what is said as a four-place relation between a sentence and its context of utterance and a reporting sentence and its context of utterance" (Insensitive Quantifiers, 38; An Abuse of Context, 174). As is acknowledged by Cappelen and Lepore, this contextualist proposal again conflicts with semantic minimalism's restriction of semantic context sensitivity to only words whose context sensitivity is "completely obvious" (A Tall Tale, 94). It should be appreciated, however, that the problem is not merely that the alleged context sensitivity of 'said that' is not a "completely obvious"; the real problem is that the reasoning Cappelen and Lepore invoke to support contextualism with regard to 'said that' is a CSA, the form of argument that they themselves reject on the grounds that it violates their fundamental methodological principle. To appreciate this point, note that what compels Cappelen and Lepore to suggest that 'said that' designates a four place relation -- as opposed to a minimal two-place relation between sayers and things said -- is a threatened contradiction with regard to the accuracy of indirect speech reports such as (1). So, just as the contextualist analysis of 'to rain' is motivated by intuitions to the effect that some (simultaneous) utterances of 'It's raining' are accurate while others are not, so Cappelen and Lepore's contextualist analysis of 'said that' is motivated by intuitions to the effect that some utterances of (1) are accurate while others are not. If the former CSA supporting the context sensitivity of 'to rain' is unsound because it crucially depends upon the mistaken assumption (MA) that "the intuitions appealed to . . . are the sorts of intuitions a semantic theory must accommodate" (Context Shifting Arguments, 52), then Cappelen and Lepore's CSA in support of the context sensitivity of 'said that' is also unsound because it also crucially depends upon this mistaken assumption.

The obvious response to these inconsistencies would be for Cappelen and Lepore to retract the conclusion that 'said that' is semantically context sensitive, and reject as unsound the CSAs they surreptitiously invoked to support this conclusion. The appropriate, seemingly consistent, way for Cappelen and Lepore to account for the intuitions elicited in the recently presented CSA involving (1) would be for them to claim that 'said that' has as its minimal, invariant, semantic content a straightforward two-place relation whose relata are things that say (speakers and/or utterances) and things that are said (contents). It would follow that all (simultaneous) utterances of (1) semantically encode the same minimal semantic content. Though, and now comes the familiar point motivated by the methodological principle, this claim regarding the inter-contextual stability of (1) does not preclude different utterances of this sentence from saying different things.

But this retreat to semantic minimalism, i.e. invariantism, with regard to indirect speech reports also does not sit well with Cappelen and Lepore's two-part programme. There are two related problems. First, invariantism with regard to indirect speech reports is incompatible with thesis (ii) of speech act pluralism. Our example involving utterances of (1) provides a particular instance of the second thesis of speech act pluralism:

(ii*)     The set of propositions Perry said by uttering 'It's raining' varies between contexts of interpretation: relative to one interpreter, Perry said that the weather is crummy for tennis, but relative to another interpreter Perry did not say that the weather is crummy for tennis.

Given semantic minimalism concerning indirect speech reports, 'Perry said that the weather is crummy for tennis' is context invariant, and thus it is not true that relative to one interpreter, Perry said that the weather is crummy for tennis, but relative to another interpreter Perry did not say that the weather is crummy for tennis. (Of course an utterance of that previous, italicized, sentence might have true speech act content, but such content is, I hope, irrelevant here. If there ever were a context in which we need to rely on the inter-contextual stability of semantic content, this is it.) So, adherence to the fundamental methodological principle that undermines CSAs requires Cappelen and Lepore to be semantic minimalists, i.e. invariantists, with regard to indirect speech reports, but minimalism with regard to indirect speech reports is incompatible with the strong thesis of speech act pluralism.

The second reason semantic minimalism with regard to indirect speech reports does not sit well with Cappelen and Lepore's two-part programme is that invariantism with regard to indirect speech reports undermines the methodological point that allegedly shows CSAs to be unsound. Suppose again that Perry, in sunny Palo Alto, utters 'It's raining' and his utterance is intuitively false. Suppose Travis, in dreary London, utters 'It's raining' and his utterance is intuitively true. The apparent contradiction is to be avoided not by providing a contextualist semantics for 'to rain', but rather by distinguishing between semantic content and speech act content: though what Perry says is false, and what Travis says is true, the sentence they both utter encodes the same minimal semantic content. But can this methodological point be coherently expressed if we continue to take seriously our intuitions about what utterances say, but -- in keeping with semantic minimalism -- use 'said that' in a context-invariant way? Suppose that it is raining -- the metaphysical and semantic facts determine that the minimal semantic content of 'It's raining' is true. What the methodological point would have us maintain then is that though Perry said at least the minimal semantic content of the sentence he uttered, viz. that it is raining, which is true, he also said that it is raining in Palo Alto, which is false, and it is the latter proposition which accounts for the intuitions elicited by the contextualists. But if the semantics of 'said that' is invariantist, can it be maintained that Perry said this more specific false proposition? It seems not. For there are some contexts of interpretation in which it would be "accurate" to report Perry's utterance by uttering, 'Perry said it's raining, but he did not say it is raining in Palo Alto'. (Imagine a conversation in which doubt has been raised with regard to whether Perry had any location in mind at all -- rumor has it that he has a little Z-lander in him.) So, there are some "accurate" utterances of 'Perry did not say that it is raining in Palo Alto'. Thus, if we are invariantists with regard to indirect speech reports, we also must conclude that Perry did not say that it is raining in Palo Alto. But then we can hardly accuse the contextualists of conflating the false speech act content said by Perry's utterance, viz. that it's raining in Palo Alto, with the true semantic content of the sentence he uttered, viz., that it's raining, because, to repeat, Perry's utterance did not say that it's raining in Palo Alto.

Cappelen and Lepore's two-part reconciliation project thus faces a significant dilemma. On the one horn there is the second inconsistency they acknowledge: their contextualist analysis of 'said that' is incompatible with semantic minimalism's prohibition against non-completely-obvious context sensitive words, and, more significantly, this contextualist analysis is supported by CSAs that violate their own fundamental methodological principle. But, on the other horn, semantic minimalism, i.e. invariantism, with regard to 'said that' is incompatible with the strong thesis of speech act pluralism, and moreover it undermines the fundamental methodological point utilized to block CSAs in support of contextualism. Of course Cappelen and Lepore could avoid both horns if they simply denied the accuracy of the intuitions concerning what is said that are elicited by CSAs. If they simply refused to countenance these shifty intuitions concerning what utterances say, they would not find themselves in the unfortunate position of having to explain them using either context sensitive or invariant indirect speech reports. But denying the shifty intuitions elicited by CSAs is tantamount to rejecting the apparent ubiquity of context sensitivity, in which case there would be no puzzle for Cappelen and Lepore's two-part programme to solve. Something has to go.[4]

Despite what might be suggested by its title, Liberating Content does not actually liberate any heretofore unpublished content; all of the papers collected in the volume have been previously published elsewhere, and moreover -- as the author's themselves point out -- there is considerable overlap between the "Alleged Connection" series and the authors' previous book Insensitive Semantics (2005), as well as between the "Varieties of Quotation" series and the authors' other previous book Language Turned on Itself (2007). Liberating Content does, however, begin with a new and helpful introductory chapter in which the authors describe significant connections between the papers the two series comprise and characterize the relationship between the collected papers and some of their more recent publications.[5] And it ought to be said that though all of the collected papers were previously published, some were published only in relatively obscure places. So, even though this book does not offer much in the way of new material, it may be a useful resource for those of us trying to make sense of, and keep up with, Cappelen and Lepore's rapidly developing, and shifting, views on the topics addressed.

REFERENCES

Cappelen, H. 2012. Philosophy without Intuitions. Oxford University Press.

Cappelen, H. and Hawthorne, J. 2009. Relativism and Monadic Truth. Oxford University Press.

Cappelen, H. and Lepore, E. 2005. Insensitive Semantics: A Defense of Semantic Minimalism and Speech Act Pluralism. Blackwell Publishing.

Cappelen, H. and Lepore, E. 2007. Language Turned on Itself: The Semantics and Pragmatics of Metalinguistic Discourse.Oxford University Press.

Lepore, E. and Stone, M. (2015). Imagination and Convention: Distinguishing Grammar and Inference in Language. Oxford University Press.


[1] Several papers in the "Alleged Connection" series also criticize the "binding argument" in support of contextualism.

[2] Note that if indirect speech reports are semantically context sensitive, then in stating (ii) Cappelen and Lepore are using 'relative to one interpreter' as a monster. Elsewhere however they claim that are no such monsters in natural language (Context Shifting Arguments, 67).

[3] Cappelen and Lepore (2007) is concerned to resolve this first inconsistency.

[4] In their more recent work Cappelen and Lepore seem to move away from both semantic minimalism and the methodological principle. In the final paper in the "Alleged Connection" series Cappelen seems to endorse CSAs in support of content relativism. And Lepore and Stone (2015) advocates a view that is arguably a version of radical pragmatics.

[5] In particular, Cappelen and Hawthorne (2009) and Cappelen (2012) are characterized as being "continuous with" (2, note 1) semantic minimalism, whereas Lepore and Stone's (2015) is characterized as presenting an alternative to semantic minimalism.