2016.05.18

Alexus McLeod

Theories of Truth in Chinese Philosophy: A Comparative Approach

Alexus McLeod, Theories of Truth in Chinese Philosophy: A Comparative Approach, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 197pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783483457.

Reviewed by Bryan W. Van Norden, Vassar College


This book provides an overview of philosophical theories of truth and semantics in ancient China, using contemporary analytic philosophy of language as an interpretive framework. The discussion is limited to Chinese philosophy prior to the intellectual revolution caused by Buddhism. However, the period Alexus McLeod focuses on (551 BCE-220 CE) is philosophically rich. This book is accessible to mainstream philosophers, generally well argued, and plausible in most of its conclusions.

McLeod agrees with earlier interpreters on several key points regarding ancient Chinese philosophers: they are concerned with whether claims are true (in at least a "thin" sense of "true"), and almost all regard truth as a crucial component of an adequate philosophical "Way" (ix-x, 33-34); they offer competing accounts of the proper criteria to identify which claims are true. Further, the preceding points are consistent with acknowledging that ancient Chinese philosophers were not concerned with many of the metaphysical and epistemological issues that have bedeviled Western philosophers (105-106); instead, ancient Chinese philosophers were primarily interested in ethics, political philosophy, and philosophical psychology, but did discuss truth and semantics insofar as these were relevant. (Philosophical psychology, political philosophy, and ethics continue to be important throughout Chinese philosophy, but metaphysics and epistemology will later vie with them for importance among Buddhists, Neo-Confucians, New Confucians, and Marxists.)

The preceding doctrines have become something like the consensus among informed scholars of Chinese thought. See, for example, A.C. Graham, Disputers of the Tao (La Salle, IL: Open Court Press, 1989), especially Appendix 2; Graham, Later Mohist Logic, Ethics, and Science (Hong Kong: Chinese University Press, 1978); Bryan W. Van Norden, Virtue Ethics and Consequentialism in Early Chinese Philosophy (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2007), pp. 1-23, 361-380; and Christoph Harbsmeier, Language and Logic, Vol 7, Part 1, of Joseph Needham, ed., Science and Civilisation in China (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1998). (A surprising omission in this book is that no works by Harbsmeier are cited.) However, McLeod provides a clear and easily digestible overview of the debates on these topics, and he also advances some original interpretations of particular passages and thinkers. In this review, I'll discuss some representative examples of McLeod's engagement with classical debates and of his more original contributions.

One of the ancient Chinese schools most interesting from a contemporary philosophical perspective is the Mohists. The Three Standards that the Mohists propose for evaluating statements are "the affairs of the ancient sage kings . . . what the people have heard and seen . . . the benefit of the people" (61). Broadly speaking, there are two lines of interpretation of the Three Standards. The earliest view is that the Three Standards are methodological or epistemological: they specify criteria for identifying which statements are true (where "true" is implicitly characterized in terms of correspondence). On this reading, appealing to the "affairs of the ancient sage kings" is not a fallacious argument from authority, but is rather based on the fact that "certain ways of action, certain policies of state, certain beliefs, have brought about beneficial consequences, while others have resulted in ruin and degeneration. Why then should we not profit by the lessons of history . . . ?" (Hu Shih, The Development of the Logical Method in Ancient China [Shanghai: The Oriental Book Company, 1922], p. 79). We might also compare the First Standard to Aristotle's principle that a theory, especially in ethics, should agree with the opinions of the wise, as much as possible (Nicomachean Ethics I.8; Topics I.1).

The second major line of interpretation is that the Three Standards are not criteria of truth, but are rather pragmatic criteria for choosing which practices (including linguistic practices) to follow. On this reading, we might admit that a statement is false, or simply remain agnostic about whether it is true, but assert the statement anyway because it satisfies the Three Standards. (Hui-chieh Loy defends something close to this view, but with significant qualifications, in "Justification and Debate: Thoughts on Moist Moral Epistemology," Journal of Chinese Philosophy [September 2008] 35:3, p. 455-471.)

The Mohists apply the Three Standards to the statement, "there is fate." (Roughly, the issue is the extent to which individual human agency affects outcomes that are also dependent upon the actions of others and upon one's natural environment.) They argue that "there is fate" fails all Three Standards: the wisest people of history have never endorsed a belief in fate; no one has ever seen or heard the supposed entity "fate"; and believing in fate has bad consequences (e.g., leading people to be lazy). According to the first interpretation of the Three Standards, the Mohists are claiming that "there is fate" is false (and our evidence for this is that the statement fails to satisfy our best criteria for identifying what is true); according to the second interpretation, the Mohists are claiming that we should not assert "there is fate" (because, whether it is true or not, asserting this statement violates the best action-guiding standards we have).

McLeod suggests that both sides in this debate have taken for granted that the relevant kind of "truth" is a correspondence theory. The first side in the debate holds that the Three Standards are criteria of truth (where truth is implicitly correspondence to reality), while the other side in the debate argues that the Three Standards are practical criteria for determining what should be action-guiding (and hence cannot be criteria of truth, because truth is assumed to be correspondence to reality). However, McLeod points out that the Mohists could be concerned with truth, but be proposing a resolutely pragmatic theory of truth, in which satisfying the best criteria for the assertibility of an utterance is the definition of truth.

One problem with attributing a pragmatic theory of truth to the Mohists is that they explicitly discuss a case in which acting in a certain way has excellent consequences even though the actions are based on something that the Mohists suppose (for the sake of the argument) is not the case. Specifically, the Mohists argue that, even if the spirits of the ancestors do not exist, the practices done in their honor (ritual offerings and communal banquets) are valuable because they bring (living) members of the family and the broader community together. McLeod does discuss the crucial passage, and attempts to explain how it is consistent with attributing to the Mohists a pragmatic theory of truth (69-70). I hope I have not overlooked anything, but I could not understand his argument on this point. Were I defending a view like McLeod's, I would argue that the point of the troublesome passage is that the practices in question definitely satisfy the Third Standard, even if one does not agree that they satisfy the First and Second Standards. Satisfaction of all Three Standards is necessary and sufficient for truth (defined pragmatically), but satisfaction of at least one standard might justify following a practice (or at least justify humoring an established custom) without regarding it as based on a true claim.

The Mohists were insistent critics of the Confucians. The philosopher who revived Confucianism in the face of the Mohist critique was Mengzi. McLeod makes some interesting passing remarks about Mengzi, but I noticed two problems in his discussion. First, he seems unaware of David S. Nivison's seminal essay, "Weakness of Will in Ancient Chinese Philosophy" (The Ways of Confucianism [La Salle, IL: Open Court Press, 1996], pp. 79-90) which includes a discussion of the role of yan ("doctrines") in Mengzi's thought. Familiarity with Nivison's work would not only have deepened McLeod's discussion of Mengzi's views on language and truth (53-57), but also allowed him to recognize that the Daoist Zhuangzi's doctrine of the "fasting of the mind" (110-111) is an implicit critique of Mengzi. Second, here (and in a few other places) McLeod forgets the Platinum Rule of translation: a translation is not a translation unless it can be understood by those who do not read the original language. Consider his translation of 4B17 (which he misnumbers 4B45): "Words that are without shi are not auspicious. The fruit (shi) of not being auspicious is obscuration of the fittingness of the sages' activity" (54). The original Chinese is admittedly hard to translate, but that doesn't relieve the translator of his responsibility to render it into comprehensible English. I understand that McLeod does not want to beg the question of whether "shi" means true here, but an idiomatic translation would be something like, "Untrue doctrines are ill-omened. But what counts as truly ill-omened is keeping worthy people in obscurity." McLeod translates the same passage very differently later in the book (147), but the result is still awkward.

Specialists on Chinese philosophy of language will be surprised to discover that McLeod chooses to skip over the "School of Names" and barely mentions the "Later Mohists." Both have interesting and challenging things to say about the philosophy of language and truth. McLeod explains that the "later Mohist material gives interpreters lots to work with and draws them because it's so terse, unclear, ambiguous, and difficult, somewhat similar to the 'School of Names' literature. . . . It's compatible with a great deal" (72, emphasis in original). Well, yes, but scholars of ancient Western philosophy would have no patience with someone writing on the pre-Socratics who decided to skip Heraclitus because his fragments are terse, ambiguous, and compatible with many different interpretations.

The preceding philosophers wrote during the classical period in Chinese philosophy, which has received considerable scholarly attention. In the final section of the book, McLeod examines some philosophers from the Han dynasty (202 BCE-220 CE), a period that is understudied. One of McLeod's most original suggestions is that the Han dynasty philosopher Wang Chong held a pluralistic theory of truth, according to which the property that makes a statement true in a moral context is different from what makes a statement true in a non-moral context. His evidence for this claim is that Wang distinguishes between "right and wrong principles" (shi fei zhi li) and "the difference between what is the case and what is not the case" (ran fou zhi fen) (157). This hypothesis is immediately suspicious, because it projects the fact/value dichotomy of post-Humean Western philosophy onto ancient Chinese philosophy. If Wang Chong makes this distinction, he is the first and last Chinese philosopher to do so over two millennia. In addition, I worry that McLeod has misidentified a grammatical distinction as a semantic distinction regarding truth-making properties. The Chinese "shi" (is-right) and "fei" (is-wrong) typically take nominal phrases as their subjects, while "ran" (is-so) and "fou" (is-not-so) normally take as their subjects sentences and verbal phrases. However, both pairs of terms can be used to describe what a Humean would distinguish as evaluative or descriptive claims.

Consider the following examples. In order to make the point that common opinions are often mistaken, Wang Chong says,

There once was a precious stone, which the common people tossed aside, but [the master jeweler] treasured it. Who was right (shi) and who was wrong (fei)? Who can be trusted? In what era has it not been the case (bu ran) that what is proper has been at variance with common customs? (Lun Heng, "Ziji")

McLeod claims that shi and fei are normative, while ran and fou are descriptive. However, here, the factual error of the common people in regarding the precious stone as worthless is described using shi and fei, while the normative problem of common customs being at variance with what is proper is described using ran. Consider another example: "Contemporary people believe in specious texts, regarding everything that has been written down as something passed down by the sages and worthies, as if none of it were affairs that were not the case (bu ran). Hence, they trust them and regard them as right (shi zhi)" (Lun Heng, "Shu Xu"). Wang Chong does not draw a sharp distinction here between description and evaluation. "Sages and worthies" have moral authority, so it is as much a normative issue whether what texts report them saying and doing "is-not-so" (bu ran) as it is whether people "regard them as right" (shi zhi). McLeod would object: "What is the reason for using two different formulations here, shi-fei and ran-fou, if [Wang Chong] means something like 'truth and falsity' in both cases? It is implausible that this should be seen as simply using synonyms" (157). Admittedly, the expressions are not synonymous; they cannot be substituted for one another salva veritate in the preceding examples. But this is because they function differently grammatically, not because they identify different properties.

McLeod ends the book with the intriguing suggestion that Chinese discussions of truth can help us to overcome a one-sided focus on truth as a property of statements. He quotes the passage from Shakespeare's Henry V when the Duke of Exeter tells the king, "thou are framed of the firm truth of valour" (36). This sense of "true" is still present in expressions like "true friend." McLeod argues that "this is not simply homophony" (176). Recent analytic philosophy has made great progress in understanding the sentential use of "true," but has lost sight of its connection to such non-sentential uses. Because Chinese philosophy gives equal importance to the sentential and non-sentential concepts of "truth," McLeod suggests that we should look to it for ways of bridging the two senses (177). Although this is only given as a suggestion for further research, I find it original and potentially productive.

Although I have expressed a few reservations, I think McLeod's book will be very valuable for specialists on Chinese philosophy, most of whom are not conversant with its technical topic. In addition, this book is really a must-read for any analytic philosopher of language: as McLeod points out (5), we need a theory that accounts for more than just how the truth predicate functions in English and other European languages. The Chinese philosophy of language provides a treasure-trove of examples and interpretive options. This book is a good place for analytic philosophers to start learning about some of the issues in ancient Chinese philosophy of language.