2016.05.26

Terence Cuneo

Speech and Morality: On the Metaethical Implications of Speaking

Terence Cuneo, Speech and Morality: On the Metaethical Implications of Speaking, Oxford University Press, 2014, 259pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712725.

Reviewed by James Edwin Mahon, Lehman College, CUNY


There are many works of metaethics that are devoted to the analysis of specifically moral discourse. Indeed, the early non-cognitivists wrote books with titles such as Language, Truth and Logic, Ethics and Language, and The Language of Morals. Terence Cuneo's latest book differs from theirs in two respects. First, Cuneo is a cognitivist and moral realist. Moral thought and discourse purport to represent moral facts, and they succeed. Second, his concern is with speech in general. To be more precise, his concern is with speech acts in general, such as making assertions, making promises, asking questions, and issuing commands. Speech acts are to be differentiated from mere "communicative acts," which can be performed by non-human animals, and mere "proto-speech acts," which can be performed by very young children, as well as some non-human animals (72). Speech acts are special. They are so special, indeed, that if they occur at all, it follows that moral facts exist: "On the assumption that agents perform speech acts, it follows that moral facts, realistically interpreted, exist" (2). From the seemingly innocuous claim that we assert, promise, command, and so forth, it follows that moral realism, of a robust sort, is true.

The "transcendental" (viii) "Speech Act Argument" (24) for moral realism is as follows. In addition to moral facts such as that it is morally wrong to torture someone simply because she has inconvenienced you (188), there are moral facts such as that it is morally wrong (or prima facie morally wrong[1]) to promise do something with no intention of doing it (108).[2] Moral facts of the latter kind are among the necessary conditions for the possibility of speech acts (viii). Were it not true that it is morally wrong to promise do something with no intention of doing it, there would be no such thing as promising. But there is such a thing as promising. So it is morally wrong to promise do something with no intention of doing it.

Although Cuneo acknowledges that one could give the "hard line reply" (165) that we do not perform any speech acts, he thinks -- plausibly enough -- that this strategy is "deeply unattractive" (171). A better response is to deny that moral facts are among the necessary conditions for the possibility of speech acts, or to argue that we have independent reason for believing that there are no moral facts. His task, therefore, after the introductory summary chapter, is to argue that certain moral facts are indeed among the necessary conditions for the possibility of speech acts (chapters 2-3), that we have no independent reason for believing that there are no moral facts (chapters 4-6), and that that this new argument for moral realism can provide resources to address epistemological challenges (chapter 7).

Cuneo's new argument for moral realism is a positive argument rather than a defensive one, and it is a bold argument. Its consequences are significant. For instance, it rules out of court the Divine Command Theory of morality (a command is a speech act, and hence, moral facts are required for it to be possible (13)) as well as those moral theories that would seek to derive morality from compacts or agreements between people (a promise is a speech act, and hence, moral facts are required for it to be possible (1)).

Here I will outline in greater detail in my own fashion the argument that certain moral facts are among the necessary conditions for the possibility of speech acts, before posing an objection. I will then briefly outline Cuneo's objections to arguments against moral realism from various non-realists, and, while applauding them, pose a worry.

Speech act theories may be thought of attempts to answer this question: how it is that my uttering the sentence "Ella Fitzgerald performed Mack the Knife" can at the same time count as my making the assertion Ella Fitzgerald performed "Mack the Knife"? After all, I could utter that sentence to test a microphone, even in front of an audience, and I would not be asserting anything. And I could assert to an audience that Ella Fitzgerald played Mack the Knife without uttering anything (for example, by signing with my hands). Given that the two acts are not identical, that they do not logically imply each other, and that they do not cause each other, what explains the "hook-up" (19) between my uttering the sentence and my making the assertion? Between, as J. L. Austin would put it, the locutionary act and the illocutionary act?

One theory, inspired by Paul Grice, is what Cuneo refers to as the perlocutionary-intention theory.[3] On this account, locutionary acts count as illocutionary acts in virtue of "mere 'descriptive' facts about the speaker and her audience, such as what the speaker intends and what the audience expects" (32). When I utter the sentence "Ella Fitzgerald performed Mack the Knife," in order to test a microphone, I do not intend anything towards my audience; hence, I make no assertion. It follows that my audience has no right to correct me if what I say is inaccurate. But when I announce to my audience, "Ella Fitzgerald performed Mack the Knife," with the intention of having my audience believe, by means of the recognition of this intention, that she sang that song, I make an assertion. Since I am making an assertion, my audience now has the right to correct me if I what I say is inaccurate. The speech act of assertion can be understood as follows:

(a) A utters the sentence "XYZ"

(b) A intends that A's audience believe, by means of the recognition of this intention, that XYZ

As Cuneo points out, the problem is that is easy to think of examples of people being rightly subject to correction for inaccuracy in what they say even if condition (b) is absent. For instance, what I write down in my top secret journal (to be burned before my death), is rightly subject to correction if inaccurate, and my pronouncement to an audience whom I know disbelieves me (hence, I form no intention that they believe me), is rightly subject to correction if inaccurate, even though I have no intention that anyone believe what I write or say. More unusually, a Nature mystery cultist attempting to manipulate the vast and completely impersonal force that is nature by uttering "Nature is eternal. May its power be manifest!" (52) is rightly subject to correction for inaccuracy if what he says happens to be overheard: "She [an eavesdropper] might, for example, point out that we have decisive reason to believe that Nature is not eternal" (59). Unlike the case of microphone-testing, these speakers -- for they are speakers -- are "on the normative hook" (32) for what they say. They are asserting, despite the absence of the relevant intentions.

Against the perlocutionary-intention theory stands the normative theory of speech acts, which is credited to John Searle and William P. Alston. On this account, locutionary acts count as illocutionary acts in virtue of normative facts, not descriptive facts (about intentions). When an ordinary adult in standard conditions utters the sentence, "Ella Fitzgerald performed Mack the Knife," he is, at the very least, rightly subject to correction if what he says is inaccurate (if she never sang that song), because of the existence of the norm of accuracy (the norm is something like Grice's supermaxim of quality: "Try to make your contribution one that is true"[4]). If a speaker is rightly subject to correction if what he says is inaccurate, then he is asserting. The speech act of assertion can be understood as follows:

(a) A utters the sentence "XYZ"

(b) A is rightly subject to correction if it is not the case that XYZ

(c) (etc.)

Cuneo, however, wishes to go further. Defenders of the normative theory do not hold that any of the normative facts that account for speech acts are moral facts (with the exception of Nicholas Wolterstorff, who seems to hold that all of the normative facts are moral facts). Cuneo, by contrast, holds that many of the normative facts that ­account for speech acts are moral facts. When an ordinary adult in standard conditions utters the sentence, "Ella Fitzgerald performed Mack the Knife," he is not merely on the normative hook for accuracy. He is on the moral hook, too. For example, he is rightly subject to admonishment if he believes that what he says is false, or to blame if he doesn't believe that what he says is true. "In the case of assertions, it is . . . our being liable to correction, admonishment, or blame if things are not as we present them" that is "explanatorily central" (222). This is due to the existence of moral facts, such as that it is (prima facie) morally wrong to deliberately deceive someone (95), and that it is (prima facie) morally wrong to treat people in a condescending fashion (85). If a speaker is rightly subject to admonishment or blame for saying what is false or what he does not believe is true, then he is asserting. If he is not rightly subject to either, then he is not asserting -- he is testing a microphone, or being ironic, or acting on stage, or telling a joke, etc. The speech act of assertion can be understood as follows:

(a) A utters the sentence "XYZ"

(b) A is rightly subject to correction if it is not the case that XYZ

(c) A is rightly subject to admonishment if A believes that XYZ is false

(d) A is rightly subject to blame if A does not believe that XYZ is true

(e) (etc.)

Moral facts like these make assertion possible. Were it not true that it is (prima facie) morally wrong to deliberately deceive someone, there would be no asserting. This is the 'moral theory' of speech acts.[5] Since we do assert, it follows that such moral facts exist. As he says:

In our ordinary day-to-day lives, all of us (ordinary adults in standard conditions) speak. But if so, then we have the rights, responsibilities, and obligations of being a speaker. If we have these rights, responsibilities, and obligations, however, then moral facts exist, for many of these rights, responsibilities, and obligations are moral (178).

And if these moral facts exist, then other moral facts exist, too.

While I am extremely sympathetic to Cuneo's argument against the perlocutionary-intention theory, I am not yet convinced of the truth of the 'moral' theory of speech acts. I do not yet agree that moral facts are among the necessary conditions for the possibility of speech acts. To refer to his own counterexamples, even if I am rightly subject to correction for what I write in my secret diary because it is false, and hence, even if the accuracy norm is necessary for asserting, it seems that I am not rightly subject to admonishment, or blame, if what I write in my secret diary is untruthful, or if I don't believe it to be true. After all, I don't intend for anyone to read it. I don't intend to deceive anyone, or to treat anyone condescendingly. Do I therefore not assert, or are moral facts not necessary for asserting? The same can be said of a Nature mystery cultist who says what he believes is false, or does not believe to be true, to Nature, but not to anyone. His eavesdropper may correct him for inaccuracy, but surely may not admonish or blame him for being untruthful to Nature. Did he therefore not assert, or are moral facts not necessary for asserting? Finally, if I make an untruthful pronouncement to an audience, without any intention that they believe me, then I have no deceptive intent. According to some accounts, I am not lying; according to other accounts, I am engaged in non-deceptive lying;[6] either way, it is questionable if I rightly subject to admonishment. It is not clear if there is a moral fact of the kind: that it is (prima facie) morally wrong to be untruthful without deceptive intent. If there is not, do I therefore not assert, or are moral facts not necessary for asserting? It is certainly possible to hold that I assert.[7] If this is right, then moral facts would not be necessary for asserting.

Of course, the 'moral' theory of speech acts assumes that there is no problem with moral facts. If we have independent reason for believing that there are no moral facts -- e.g., that there is no such fact as that it is (prima facie) morally wrong to deliberately deceive someone -- then the theory would have to be abandoned. Our options then would be to deny that we speak (the "hard line reply"), or deny that there are any moral facts but accept that there are normative facts and hold that these facts are sufficient to make speaking possible. Cuneo calls this latter position the "mixed view" (26). He devotes chapters 4 and 5 to arguments that support the mixed view. Chapter 4, in particular, is a tour de force of metaethics in its own right. I can only convey a little of its brilliance here.

Cuneo takes on four arguments that support the mixed view: the Knowledge Argument (unattributed) ("There is no satisfactory account of how we reliably grasp moral facts" (112)); the Explanation Argument, attributed to Crispin Wright ("Moral facts do not play a privileged explanatory role" (116)); the Categoricity Argument, attributed to J. L. Mackie and Richard Joyce ("Necessarily, if there are moral facts, then there are categorical reasons" but "There are no categorical reasons" (119)); and the Motivation Argument, attributed to Simon Blackburn and Allan Gibbard ("Moral judgments are intrinsically motivating" so "moral judgments do not express beliefs" (136)). He finds fault with them all. The Knowledge Argument that we cannot reliably grasp moral facts is too powerful. If accepted, it would give us equally good reason to reject the existence of "the norm concerning assertion" (114), that is, the norm of accuracy, which is necessary for asserting. The same is true of the Explanation Argument. The argument that moral facts are not necessary for explaining anything, if accepted, it would give us equally good reason to reject the existence of normative facts like the norm of accuracy. The Categoricity Argument suffers from a different problem. It gives us no non-arbitrary reason for maintaining that moral reasons must be categorical reasons, and for rejecting moral facts (e.g., that it is (prima facie) morally wrong to deliberately deceive someone), when it is possible to defend moral facts, and maintain that moral reasons may be Humean, non-categorical reasons. The same is true of the Motivation Argument. It gives us no non-arbitrary reason for maintaining that moral judgments must be intrinsically motivating, and for rejecting moral facts, when it is possible to defend moral facts, and maintain that moral judgments are only motivating "provided that her judgment is well-formed" (141).

Cuneo seems to gets the better of his opponents here, at least if you agree that it is more plausible to believe in the (prima facie) wrongness of deception than in the categoricity of moral reasons or the intrinsic motivatingness of moral judgments. He does so at a cost, however, since he allows that moral reasons can be non-categorical reasons that do not "play a silencing function" (131), as they are ordinarily understood to do, and he embraces motivational externalism about moral judgments, allowing that it is possible to not be motivated, even in some degree, to do what one judges it morally right to do. This is a less 'moral' moral realism.

Chapter 6 rejects the account of moral facts found in error theory, expressivism, and constructivism, on the basis of the Speech Act Argument. It is another masterful chapter, which relies on the arguments of the earlier chapters in bringing down the various antirealist positions. Of course, its success is ultimately relative to the soundness of the arguments in the earlier chapters. I have expressed my objection to the argument for the 'moral' theory of speech acts, as well as my worry about the final moral realism being insufficiently moral. These concerns notwithstanding, this is a superb book, original and highly rigorous, and one that rewards repeated reading.


[1] Cuneo says "pro tanto" rather than prima facie, and admits that "I use the term 'pro tanto' in much the same way that others use the term 'prima facie'" (21). However, the terms prima facie and pro tanto are different in meaning. See Andrew E. Reisner, "Prima Facie and Pro Tanto Oughts," in The International Encyclopedia of Ethics, Hugh LaFollette (ed.) (Blackwell, 2013), 4082-4086.

[2] Cuneo says that he will "use the phrase 'to break a promise' somewhat loosely to stand for the phenomenon of failing, when promising, to intend to do as one says" (108). But there is an important difference between making a promise with no intention of keeping it (a so-called 'lying promise'), and making a promise and deciding, later, to break it. As Kant says: "To cheat is to make a lying promise. Breach of faith is when we promise something truthfully, but do not have so high a regard for the promise as to keep it" (Lectures on Ethics, Peter Heath (tr.), Peter Heath and J. B. Schneewind (eds.) (Cambridge University Press, 1997), 204).

[3] It is named after Austin's third category of act, a perlocutionary act. If I affect my audience with my illocutionary act, as opposed to merely my locutionary act, that is a perlocutionary act -- for example, if my assertion informs them of something.

[4] Grice, Studies in the Ways of Words, 27.

[5] Cuneo never calls it that, although it seems that he should; he continues to refer to his theory as the normative theory of speech acts.

[6] See my "The Definition of Lying and Deception," Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

[7] Bernard Williams has said that the "standard conditions" of asserting are: "A utters a sentence, 'S', where 'S' means that P, in doing which either he expresses his belief that P, or he intends the person addressed to take it that he believes that P" (Truth and Truthfulness (Princeton University Press, 2002), 74). This would make the case under discussion not an assertion. But this is controversial.