Don Garrett


Don Garrett, Hume, Routledge, 2015, 360pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415283342.

Reviewed by Deborah Boyle, College of Charleston

This is an excellent book. Garrett provides a comprehensive yet concise introduction to Hume's thought that should be accessible to newcomers to Hume, including upper-level undergraduates. It is not especially ground-breaking; much of the book is based on work Garrett has published in papers over the past two decades and in his 1997 book, Cognition and Commitment in Hume's Philosophy. Nonetheless, even those already familiar with his work will find it illuminating to see how interpretations that were previously published separately fit into his unified interpretation of Hume's thought.

The book contains ten chapters that focus on the main themes of the Treatise, the two Enquiries, and the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. There is a very brief discussion of The Natural History of Religion, and passing mention of some of Hume's essays; Garrett does not say much about Hume's writings on economics or political theory.

Chapter 1, "'A ruling passion'," sets the stage with an account of Hume's life and writings. Garrett gives the basic facts of Hume's biography, but nicely frames the story around Hume's and others' assessments of his character, such as Hume's own claims that his "ruling passions" were "a passion for literature" and a "love of literary fame" (p. 9), his mother's alleged description of Hume as "uncommon wake-minded" (which Garrett suggests means that Hume was "lost in his own thoughts" [pp. 11-12]), and Adam Smith's letter recounting Hume's "great and amiable qualities" (p. 34).

Chapters 2 and 3 cover basic terms that Hume employs in his epistemology and philosophy of mind, material that will be familiar to seasoned readers of Hume. Chapter 2, "Perceptions and their principles," carefully spells out what Hume means by "impressions," "ideas," "liveliness," "vivacity," and so on, and explains principles ascribed to Hume in the secondary literature -- the Copy Principle, the Separability Principle, the Conceivability Principle, and the Principle of the Association of Ideas. Chapter 3, "The mind and its faculties," addresses Hume's account of imagination, memory, demonstrative reasoning, probable reasoning, the senses, the passions, and the will. This chapter also contains an interesting but brief discussion of Hume's naturalistic account of consciousness (p. 85, p. 113).

Garrett's own compelling interpretation of Hume is most visible in Chapters 4 and 5. In Chapter 4, "Sense-based concepts," he argues that what he calls "immediate sense-based concepts" such as "blue," "warmth," "beauty," and "virtue" share certain key features and are formed in similar ways, and then makes a compelling case that Hume treats the concept of causation as sharing those same features and as being formed in a largely analogous way. Chapter 5, "Normative concepts," turns specifically to Humean concepts that are both sense-based and normative: the aesthetic and ethical normative concepts of "beauty," "deformity," "virtue," and "vice." Garrett gives an account of how Hume thinks these terms come to play a normative role in human life, and then draws parallels between that process and the process by which the epistemic terms "truth," "falsehood," "probable truth," and "probable falsehood" come to be normative. The arguments in this chapter are fascinating, but will, I think, be challenging for beginners in philosophy to follow; specific examples of beliefs would have helped make the chapter clearer.

In Chapter 6, "Induction and causation," Garrett summarizes Hume's arguments about induction in the Treatise and first Enquiry, and argues that Hume's arguments are meant to show that probable inference depends not on reasoning (either probable or demonstrative), but instead on a "supposition" of the uniformity principle that derives from custom (pp. 177-9). This section, like the subsequent sections on Hume's definitions of cause and on Hume's account of liberty and necessity, concisely and clearly summarizes arguments that Garrett has defended at greater detail previously. The chapter ends with a clear and judicious summary of recent debates about whether Hume was a causal reductionist, realist, or projectivist.

Chapter 7, "Skepticism and probability," addresses the vexed question of the relationship between skepticism and naturalism in Hume. In this clear but not oversimplified chapter, Garrett discusses the types and degrees of skepticism distinguished by Hume, and Hume's "doubt-inducing" discoveries about our cognitive faculties in the Treatise and first Enquiry (p. 218). Despite Hume's view that "reason is unable to defend itself and the senses against, or completely remove, the doubts and objections produced by these discoveries" (pp. 234-5), Garrett argues that Hume finds countervailing considerations that establish that "probable reasoning and the senses . . . cannot in the end be defeated by the skeptical considerations" (p. 236). Since Hume's remarks about "the labyrinth of personal identity" are also a kind of skeptical consideration (p. 237), Garrett includes a section on that topic in this chapter.

In Chapter 8, "Morality and virtue," Garrett draws on distinctions and arguments made earlier in the book in order to expand on the sense-based normative concepts of virtue and vice. The chapter has sections on the role of reason in Hume's moral theory, on Humean natural and artificial virtues, and on moral diversity, and ends with some useful general comments on Hume's moral theory.

Chapter 9, "Religion and God," examines the nature of religious belief as well as Hume's handling of arguments for the existence of God and the problem of evil in the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. Taking up the interesting question of what Hume means by "true religion," Garrett links Philo's claims in the Dialogues to Hume's views on probability and skepticism, concluding that true religion, for Hume, consists in assent to the "very modest" claim that "there is at least 'some' probability or at least a 'remote' resemblance between the cause or causes of order in the universe and human intelligence" (p. 301).

Chapter 10 focuses on Hume's influence on his successors, with discussions of Hume's importance in the works of Reid, Kant, Mill, Russell, and the logical positivists. Garrett briefly points out the Humean strands in recent work in metaphysics, epistemology, and moral philosophy, and observes that Hume's views on religion have been invoked in the so-called "New Atheism."

There is a great deal to admire in Garrett's book. The interpretations he offers are nuanced and based on very careful readings of Hume's texts, and he is able to combine his sharp focus on the details of Hume's arguments with a panoramic view of Hume's project. In showing parallels in Hume's accounts of the concepts of beauty, virtue, and probability, Garrett reveals the systematicity in Hume's thought.

One topic that could have used further development -- and perhaps would have offered another opportunity to show parallels among different parts of Hume's project -- is the distinction Garrett ascribes to Hume between "suppositions" and "beliefs." To "suppose" something, Garrett writes, is "to act in at least many respects as though one believed something, but without necessarily forming a lively idea of it" (p. 52). As far as I know, Hume does not explicitly make a distinction between supposition and belief. If I have correctly understood Garrett's reading of Hume's critique of induction, however, Garrett thinks that Hume needs this distinction. Hume argues (says Garrett) that the mind's acceptance of the Uniformity Principle on which probable inferences rest does not derive from reasoning (either probable or demonstrative); thus the Uniformity Principle is not, strictly speaking, a belief. Rather, because the mind accepts the Uniformity Principle through "the intervention of the unreasoning imagination" (p. 179), this principle is a "supposition" (p. 177).

In addition to the "supposition" of the uniformity of nature, we suppose (on Garrett's reading of Hume) that there are secret powers and principles in nature (p. 203), and that the objects we perceive have a "continued and distinct existence" (p. 180). In the latter case, however, Hume explicitly refers to our "belief" in that continued existence; he says that this belief is "the most natural of any" (T and is among those that "we embrace by a kind of instinct or natural impulse, on account of their suitableness and conformity to the mind" (T Garrett seems to allow that a Humean supposition can also be a belief when he writes that "supposing" something involves acting as if one believes it "but without necessarily forming a lively idea of it" (p. 52, emphasis added; see also p. 177). Does Garrett think Hume has a principled distinction between suppositions that are also beliefs and those that are not? Are there are connections between Humean "suppositions" and the beliefs that Hume sometimes describes as "natural"? And do suppositions play any role in Hume's account of religion? Hume suggests in his Natural History of Religion that the "vulgar" idea of intelligent, invisible powers in nature arises from a "natural propensity" (NHR 141) combined with certain passions. This propensity is universal, Hume says (NHR 141), and in his discussion of the passions in the Treatise he suggests that the passion of fear is also both natural and instinctive (T 2.3.9). If the belief in invisible, intelligent power is instinctive and universal, then it is, arguably, a "natural belief" for Hume. The belief in intelligent invisible powers also seems to fit Garrett's description of a "supposition," insofar as Hume thinks the vulgar act as if there are such intelligent, invisible powers. So, is this small "degree of belief of invisible intelligent power" -- which Garrett says counts as "true religion" for Hume [p. 301] -- also a "supposition"? Perhaps discussions of all these issues would have been beyond the scope of this book, but I would have appreciated at least some account of the relationship between suppositions and beliefs, especially Humean "natural" beliefs.

The book has several features aimed at making it useful for students. Garrett helpfully situates Hume in historical context, focusing especially on ways in which his views were original. The book also includes a chronology of Hume's life; cross-references throughout the book to point readers to related sections; a bibliography; chapter-specific lists of books and articles for further reading; and a glossary of terms, including both Hume's own and those Garrett uses in the book to explicate Hume's thought. However, the guiding principle of which terms appear in the glossary is unclear. Many of the technical terms in the body of the text are italicized, but not all of those italicized terms are included the glossary. Students would probably have benefited both from a more perspicuous method of indicating whether a word can be found in the glossary, and from a more comprehensive glossary.

The bibliography is extensive, and each chapter ends with an annotated list of books and articles for further reading, largely consisting of works published in the past fifteen years. The book does not include the careful attention to the secondary literature characteristic of Garrett's other work.  Instead of detailing how his views differ from those of other commentators, or even providing footnotes identifying which commentators he has in mind, Garrett refers vaguely to (for example) what "many readers" have thought about Hume's account of intentionality (p. 72), how Hume's argument about induction is "often interpreted" (p. 183), and what "some have assumed" about Hume's final paragraph of Treatise 3.1.1 (p. 256). Given the book's aim to give an overview of Hume's thought, discussions of debates in the secondary literature might have been a distraction. But I am not sure the annotated lists of further reading are sufficient for readers who are not already familiar with the secondary literature and who would like to know which commentators Garrett has in mind in his critiques.

There are, unfortunately, many typographical errors in the book. Some are quite minor -- "by" where the text clearly requires "be," for example. But some are potentially more confusing, as when it is asserted that Hume "claims to discover that the perceptions involved in thinking are similar to, and derived from, the perceptions" (p. 77).

These quibbles aside, Garrett's book is an important and interesting contribution to Hume scholarship that will be valuable for both specialists and newcomers to Hume.


Hume, David. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. In Principal Writings on Religion. Ed. J. C. A. Gaskin. Oxford University Press, 1993. (Abbreviated as DNR; references are to part and paragraph number, followed by page numbers.)

Hume, David. A Treatise of Human Nature. Ed. David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton. Oxford University Press, 2000. (Abbreviated as T; references are to book, part, section, and paragraph number.)