Robert Stalnaker


Robert Stalnaker, Context, Oxford University Press, 2014, 248pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780198776871.

Reviewed by Craige Roberts, The Ohio State University

Robert Stalnaker's early work on assertion (1979) and presupposition (1974) has played a central role in almost all contemporary thinking on the relationship between linguistic content and context, and on the relationship between semantics and pragmatics. Stalnaker has continued throughout his long career to reflect on these issues and their ramifications for both philosophy of language and philosophy of mind, with a long string of books and publications attesting to this interest and its strong influence on the field. Hence, the present volume, reflecting his most recent views on the subject, is especially welcome. And the contents repay careful consideration: Far from a summary of previous work, Stalnaker focuses on recent challenges and offers important new insights into this complex domain.

The book has four interrelated themes, the first three present in Stalnaker's earlier work on context but brought more sharply into focus here with new arguments:

  • The first is the "autonomy of pragmatics", a fundamentally Gricean view in which "it is possible and fruitful to theorize about the structure and function of discourse independently of specific theory about the mechanisms that languages use to serve those functions" (p.1).
  • Second is the character of the common ground and its essential role in a Gricean framework.
  • Third is a characterization of conversational dynamics and its relationship to pragmatic presuppositions.
  • And fourth is the self-locating character of context.

After a useful introduction, Stalnaker tackles these topics in order. In chapter 1 he discusses the Gricean program as he sees it, and compares his own notion of linguistic context -- the common ground -- with those promoted by David Kaplan (1989) and David Lewis (1979b). He argues that Kaplan's notion of context is too simplistic, not sufficiently rich to serve the functions required; while (Chapter 2) Lewis' characterization of discourse as a game and the context as a scoreboard is criticized as being too rule-governed, hence inconsistent with the Gricean program. In Chapters 3 and 4, Stalnaker tackles the issue of conversational dynamics, focusing on presupposition. He argues that projection, wherein content that is under the scope of an entailment cancelling operator nonetheless seems to be part of what the speaker is committed to, is not purely a function of compositional semantics, but should be explained at least in part in pragmatic terms. Gricean reasoning, of the sort involved in the generation of conversational implicatures, "is involved at all stages of the process of interpretation", including in the projection of presuppositions.

Chapters 5-8 address several aspects of the role of context in interpretation which, Stalnaker argues, show how it is something other than the physical situation of utterance or a mere tuple of values pertaining to such a situation. Stalnaker's common ground is much richer than those characterizations; it is an iterative attitude held jointly by the interlocutors in the discourse in question, and thus it contains information about the discourse itself and the attitudes of the interlocutors. He argues that part of what it means for a context to be iterative is that it reflects the understood self-location of the interlocutors -- not just in physical space, but in logical space: their beliefs about who they are and what properties they have. In Chapter 5, Stalnaker grounds this conception in a way of modeling self-location that he first presented in Our Knowledge of the Internal World (2008), a variation on the use of centered worlds proposed by Lewis (1979a). In Chapters 6 and 7, he focuses on epistemic modals and conditionals, arguing that these are among the devices that interlocutors have developed to keep their contexts "on the same page about. . .where their attitudes agree and where they disagree." In chapter 7 he discusses subjunctive vs. indicative conditionals, and argues that the subjunctives "signal that, in the subordinate context relevant to interpreting the conditional, some presuppositions made in the basic context are being suspended" (p.12). And in Chapter 8, responding to epistemic relativists like John MacFarlane (2011), he argues for a "moderate semantic relativism" for epistemic modals, but expresses skepticism about "MacFarlane's notion of assessment sensitivity and about the idea of faultless disagreement, according to which two people may both be right even though they disagree".

It isn't possible here to discuss all the issues discussed in this rich monograph. Instead, I'll focus on the shift in the conception of common ground. To appreciate the motivation for this shift, consider the following two stories discussed in the book. The first is Mark Richard's (1993) Phone Booth story; here's Stalnaker's description (pp.123-4):

A woman in a phone booth is talking to a man. She is also watching the man, who is waving at her, but she does not realize that it is the same man. The man also does not realize that the woman he is talking to is the same woman as the one he is waving at. The woman tells the man about the man waving at her. Then she says, "The man waving at me thinks I am in danger. But you don't think I am in danger, do you?" The man replies, "No, I don't think you are in danger."

Both the man and the woman are sincere, and it seems that what each says is true. . . But the singular terms, "the man waving at me" and "you", both refer to the same person, and the terms occur outside the scope of the attitude verb. So how can both statements be true?

The second story, an extension of a story in John Perry's (1979), is due to Paolo Santorio (2012). Here's Stalnaker's presentation (2014:210ff):

Rudolf Lingens and Gustav Lauben are two amnesiacs who each know that they are one of the two, but do not know which. They have been kidnapped and will be subjected to the following experiment:

First, they will be anesthetized. Then a coin will be tossed. If the outcome is tails, Lingens will be released in Main Library, Stanford, and Lauben will be killed. If the outcome is heads, Lauben will be released in Widener Library, Harvard, and Lingens will be killed. Lingens and Lauben are informed of the plan and the experiment is executed. Later, one of them wakes up in a library.

The awakened person might make one of the following epistemic possibility statements:

(1) I might be in Main Library, Stanford.

(2) I might be in Widener Library, Harvard.

Either of these utterances would be felicitous, and our intuition as native speakers says that they would be true as spoken in the story -- on the assumption that the speaker still has amnesia and assumes that the plan was properly executed. But Kaplanian semantics predicts that these statements are false on either outcome. For example, if the actual speaker is Lingens, then even though so far as he knows he could be Lauben, the Kaplanian context assigns Lingens as the value of I, and (2) means 'Lingens might be in Widener Library, Harvard', which is false. Similarly for (1) if the awakened one is Lauben.

In both these stories, we have characters who use indexicals (you and I) in ways that are problematic for the usual direct reference account, and in each there is a question of mistaken or confused identity. Neither the woman in Phone Booth nor the man she's talking to recognize that she herself is the person that he's waving at. And in Lauben/Lingens the speaker doesn't know who he himself is, including his own name. We can say that in both cases the speaker fails to properly self-locate.

Stalnaker, drawing on Lewis (1979a), takes the key to explaining these examples to involve the use of centered possible worlds: a centered world is the pair of a center, itself a pair of an agent and a time, and a world: <<A,t>,w>. As in Lewis, such an ordered set <<A,t>,w> serves as the world of evaluation for an attitude of agent A at time t in world w. A set of such centered worlds <<B,t′>,w′> captures A's relevant attitude, e.g., A's belief state; in each such accessible world B is the individual with whom A identifies at t′ in w′ -- intuitively A's self-location in w′. Stalnaker (2008) modifies Lewis' framework in response to what he calls the problem of calibration, crucial to comparing cognitive states. Jaakko Hintikka's (1969) approach to propositional attitudes via modal accessibility relations makes possible comparison of the content of the objects of such attitudes across times and across persons: For a given individual, time and world, R(A,t,w) is the set of worlds wherein all the propositions (sets of possible worlds) that A at t in w believes to be true are true. Then two individuals A and B (or one individual at two times) believe the same proposition p at t in just in case both R(A,t,w) ⊆ p and R(B,t,w) ⊆ p. But if beliefs are sets of centered worlds, and two distinct agents' beliefs involve sets with distinct centers, how can we compare what they believe? If the same agent at distinct times corresponds to two distinct individual-time pairs, two centers, how can we compare what that agent believes at different times?

Stalnaker (2008) defines the accessibility relation over the set of centered worlds thus:

R is a binary relation on E that is transitive, Euclidean and serial, and satisfies condition (*) below. To say that <<A,t>, w> R <<B,t*>,w′> is to say that it is compatible with what A believes at time t in world w that she is in world w′, that she is person B, and that the time is time t*

(*) For any centers, c*, c′ and c′′, and worlds w and w′: if <c*,w> R <c′,w′> and <c*,w> R <c′′,w′>, then c′ = c′′.

(*) tells us that "ignorance or uncertainty about where one is in the world is always also ignorance or uncertainty about what world one is in" (Stalnaker 2008:70), a contrast with Lewis' model, in which the same center was permitted to occur in two "places" in the same world. Because of (*), for Stalnaker the contents of a belief state "can be taken to be ordinary propositions -- sets of uncentered possible worlds, even though the centers determined by a particular belief state may play a role in determining which proposition is denoted by a that-clause with indexical expressions in it" (2008:71).

As proposed by Dilip Ninan (2010), common belief can be modeled by taking the center of the base centered-world to be a group such that all believe the propositions that are true in all the accessible worlds, all believe that all believe those propositions, all believe that all believe . . . , etc. The group can be modeled as a sequence of individuals, the sequences representing where the members of the group mutually locate themselves and each other in the possible worlds compatible with their common beliefs. Common ground, as in Stalnaker (1979), is actually common acceptance, rather than common belief, coinciding with belief only "in naïve conversations." But otherwise it behaves like common belief in Ninan's sense.

Stalnaker points out (Chapter 5) that in the proposed new model of context each centered world in the common ground is itself what he calls a K-context, a version of the notion of context in Kaplan (1989), consisting of an individual a, a time t and a possible world w, used to give the interpretations of (respectively)Inow and actually. This corresponds to the centered world <<a,t>,w>. Then the common ground is a set of K-contexts, the joint attitude of the interlocutors.

This modified CG is an "infinitely iterated attitude with the structure of common knowledge that is our representation of a context in which a discourse takes place."

iterated attitudes must be defined in terms of a way of identifying the individual whose attitudes one has attitudes about. . . So to define something like the common knowledge of a group of subjects, we need to specify not just the subjects, but also the ways they identify each other. . . Even if the conversation we are concerned with consists of a group of amnesiacs discussing together who each of them might be, they will still have a shared way of identifying each other -- a basis for fixing the referents of the "I"s and "you"s in their conversation. . . in the iterated case, we get. . . multiple centering. . . So in a representation of the common ground [for a group of n individuals] there will be n individuals at the center: the individuals that they all presuppose themselves to be. (pp.121-2)

Thus in this framework the common ground of two subjects is essentially relative to the ways they have of identifying each other. The same two subjects might have different ways of identifying each other that give rise to different common grounds. In Phone Book, for example, the woman has two ways of identifying the man: 'the person I'm speaking with' and 'the man waving at me'. And both interlocutors mistakenly assume that these are distinct individuals. Stalnaker models each way of identifying an individual as an individual concept, a function from worlds to individuals. The meaning of I is such an individual concept, and it needn't be rigid, so long as its value in the world of utterance is the actual speaker. This, then, gives us the elements of a satisfying analysis for Phone Booth:

two individuals:

A: woman
B: man

three worlds:

α: the actual world, where

A is in danger
B is talking with and waving at A

β: A's belief world, with

A: herself
B1: man talking to A
B2: man waving to A
B1 ≠ B2

γ: B's belief world, as understood by A, with

A1: woman B1 is talking to = A, is not in danger
A2: woman B1 is waving at, is in danger
B1: B in g (B's center in γ)
B2: man waving at A1
A1 ≠ A2
B1 ≠ B2

And a belief-based accessibility relation R, with at least these relations between the centered worlds in question:

<A,α> R <A,β>
<B1,β> R <B1,γ>
<B,α> R <B1,γ>

A's statements:

S1: The man waving at me thinks I'm in danger.
S2: You don't think I'm in danger.

both contain complement S3: I'm in danger.

Unbeknownst to the interlocutors, the subjects of S1 and S2, the man waving at me and you, are coreferential in a, denoting B. But α is neither in the belief state of either interlocutor nor in their common ground. Both of them think that (in β and γ) B1 ≠ B2. Thus there are two different individual concepts for A in the scenario, and g, and these make both of A's statements true:

f(α) = A, f(β) = A, f(γ) = A1
g(α) = B, f(β) = A, g(γ) = A2

If I in S3 denotes f, it picks out A1 in γ, hence makes S3 false in γ (because B qua addressee -- B1 in γ -- doesn't take A/A1 to be in danger). This makes S2 true in the common ground for A and B. If denotes γ, it picks out A2 in γ. Then because the man waving at me picks out B2, who does think A2 is in danger, this makes S3 true in γ (because B qua waving-man -- B2 takes A/A2 to be in danger); hence this makes S1 true in the common ground of A and B.

The key here is that the interlocutors each know the other in two distinct ways. The truth of the belief statements depends on which of these ways is at issue, because that, in turn, is relevant in determining the accessibility relations between centered worlds: B's belief states qua person that A takes herself to be talking with differ from those qua person waving at her.

In Lauben/Lingens, to explain the intuited truth of both (1) and (2), no matter whether the awakened one is Lauben or Lingens, we note that the speaker doesn't know which of two worlds he's in, α or β, where all has gone as planned:

α:      coin lands tails

Lauben is dead, not at Stanford

Lingens survived and is speaking

speaker is in Stanford Main Library

β:       coin lands heads

Lingens is dead, not at Harvard

Lauben survived and is speaking

speaker is in Harvard Widener Library

Stalnaker entertains the possibility of taking the epistemic might to be a Kaplanian monster: might φ would be true just in case there is some K-context in the common ground in which φ is true. Then even if uttered in K-context <<Lingens,t>,α>, (2) would be true because the common ground (and the speaker's belief state) also contains a K-context <<Lauben,t>,β> and (2) is true in that K-context. But, he points out (215-216), we don't really need monsters to explain this story. As we already saw in Phone Booth, we can just give up the rigidity of I.

In Lauben/Lingens (1) and (2), the modal might is epistemic:[1] it's a question of which K-contexts are epistemically accessible from some K-context of utterance, the accessible K-contexts constituting the epistemic attitude. But whose attitude would that be? Let's assume, as is common for epistemic modals (e.g. DeRose 1991), that it's the speaker's knowledge state: that of the awakening survivor of the experiment. In all the centered worlds consistent with that state, the location of the awakened one is a function of the result of the toss -- heads, Lauben; tails, Lingens. Since these are centered worlds, whomever is the agent in the world of evaluation is identified with the center in all the accessible worlds. But in the story at hand, such a knowledge state is consistent with some accessible centered worlds in which the center is Lingens (tails worlds like α), and others in which the center is Lauben (heads worlds like β). That means that in either context of utterance some of the accessible centered worlds are like <<Lingens,t>,α>, and others are like <<Lauben,t>,β>; so that there will be at least one centered world in the modal's domain in which a given prejacent is true. Under these natural assumptions about which centered worlds are accessible, there is no shifting of the context of utterance. Instead, the epistemic modal auxiliary ranges over the same kind of domain as constitutes the complement of an attitude predicate or, on the Stalnakerian conception, a common ground: a set of centered worlds.

Note that here the value of I is not onomastically rigid across the worlds in the speaker's belief state. Instead, in worlds in that belief state where Lingens is speaking, I denotes Lingens, while in worlds where Lauben is speaking, I denotes Lauben. As soon as we admit such denotations for indexicals like you in Phone Booth, no special story need be told about I in Lauben/Lingens.

In both these examples, not only do the interlocutors not know "which world they're in" (Stalnaker 1978), but also that ignorance involves ignorance of essential features of the context of utterance: They don't know what context they're in. What Stalnaker is proposing is that in such cases, the value of an indexical may vary in just the way(s) predicted by variation in the value of the corresponding contextual parameter across the worlds in the relevant attitude: the common ground in Phone Booth, the domain of the epistemic modal in Lauben/Lingens.

Stalnaker's discussion of these examples is very astute, the use of centered worlds is independently motivated, and this elegant conception sheds new light on the underlying problems and their relationship to context. But in his terse presentation, the proposed solution raises as many questions as it answers. How does context make evident the intended value of such non-rigid individual concepts as the meanings of indexicals? How are their values to be constrained in such a way as to retain some of the well-known advantages of Kaplan's account of indexicals, especially when these occur in opaque contexts? And what might this say about other problems for Kaplan's theory of indexicals? -- e.g., the growing literature on demonstratives as bound variables (King 2001, Roberts 2002, Elbourne 2008), and the problem of shifting indexicals under attitude predicates (Schlenker 2003). The basic insight seems correct; but the details are missing. And therein, of course, lies the devil.

Still, the use of centered worlds to shed light on these puzzles and how this motivates the shift in conception of the common ground is one of the most important and promising proposals in the book. So, I believe, is the proposal to entertain indexicals which are non-rigid in some contextually limited respect. See the important work of Maria Aloni (2001) which motivates such non-rigidity in the domain of proper names in order to address a range of puzzles involving de re belief attribution; and Craige Roberts (2014) for extended arguments that the problem with indexicals (including the shifted variety) is closely related to the puzzles about de re belief.

There are several other themes of equal importance and difficulty, which Stalnaker addresses with similar creative insight and originality. Perhaps the most substantial discussion from the point of view of natural language semantics is that of conditionals and epistemic modals in chapters 6-8. Here, among other things, Stalnaker argues for an analysis of unembedded indicative utterances with epistemic might in which they are not assertions: "In saying might-φ, one is not asserting that φ is possible, relative to the prior context. Rather, one is proposing to adjust the context (if required) to bring it about that what the sentence says, relative to the posterior context -- the context as adjusted -- is true." (p.140)

The account is intended to explain "why we are in a position to make the epistemic 'might' claims we seem to be in a position to make, and also why it is often reasonable to disagree with 'might' claims made by others" (p.137-8). This is a "moderate" expressive account of the epistemic modals -- moderate in that it is formulated in truth conditional terms. Addressing the relevant work of Seth Yalcin (2011),[2] he argues that amight statement is about the "questions that are at issue in a given context" (Roberts 1996/2012): leading either to an expansion of the space of possibilities envisioned in that question or to a refinement of the question -- drawing a new distinction among the possibilities previously envisioned. So these indicative statements do something other than directly convey information. But, again, it isn't clear here how this relates to their semantics: What is the compositional contribution of might such that it shifts the usual function of indicatives in this way and yet yields the right truth conditions in embedded contexts? Stalnaker is aware of this issue, but makes only a tentative conjecture about how that might work.

Other empirical phenomena that Stalnaker addresses in the book include the semantics of indicative and subjunctive conditionals, agreement and disagreement, and predicates of personal taste. In Appendix 3, he revisits diagonalization (Stalnaker 1978), to argue that the diagonal proposition is the appropriate notion of the assertoric content of an utterance. He offers new arguments that the diagonal is the most informative proposition when interlocutors are missing essential information about the context itself. That is not to say that the diagonal is "the proposition expressed" (Dummett's 1991 ingredient sense); but that it reflects the information conveyed -- what's asserted -- in such cases. This arguably offers support for a Gricean view of what is meant. And I think it's one of the nicest uses of the diagonal that I've seen.

In sum, this is an excellent book that anyone with an interest in how context affects interpretation should read with great care. Even if one isn't interested in epistemic modals or conditionals per se, the characterization of their interpretation as essentially a function of the common ground understood as a type of attitude bears on essential questions about the nature of context and its interaction with conventional content. As in all of Stalnaker's work, there's a lot to learn here.

But I cannot resist pointing out one rather large lacuna in the whole discussion of what a context of utterance is, one only indirectly alluded to once in this book. Like almost everyone who works on context in the philosophy of language, Stalnaker concerns himself with only the types of speech acts made with indicative utterances. Nowhere is there discussion of questions, of their contributions to discourse, or of how they interact with and lead to the update of the context of utterance. Nor is there any consideration of imperative mood or directives. It seems that in contemporary philosophy generally, questions and imperatives have largely been relegated to the subject matter of speech act theory. But this is a significant oversight, as some linguists have argued at length and with significant empirical support (e.g. Roberts 2012, Portner 2007). I think Stalnaker is correct in arguing that the notion of context we need to understand linguistic meaning is more complex than a concrete situation of utterance or a set of parameters: we need a common ground that's understood in the full complexity he offers in this book. But context is more complex than the common ground; and this bears in ways that Stalnaker doesn't consider on the phenomena he considers in this book, especially on presupposition projection (Simons et al. 2009, to appear) and on the deontic and epistemic modal statements discussed in the last chapters of the book (where Stalnaker just mentions the importance of what's at issue -- the question under discussion). One hopes that the philosophical community will take note of this lacuna.


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[1] Stalnaker doesn't work out this way of explaining the example, but hints that he would use non-rigid indexicals. I trust he has in mind something along these lines.

[2] See his critique of Yalcin's approach in Appendix 5, pp.226f.