Sherry F. Colb and Michael C. Dorf

Beating Hearts: Abortion and Animal Rights

Sherry F. Colb and Michael C. Dorf, Beating Hearts: Abortion and Animal Rights, Columbia University Press, 2016, 252pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231175142.

Reviewed by Nathan Nobis, Morehouse College

In this book[1], law professors Sherry F. Colb and Michael C. Dorf argue that:

  1. many non-human animals, at least vertebrates, are morally considerable and prima facie wrong to harm because they are sentient, i.e., conscious and capable of experiencing pains and pleasures;
  2. most aborted human fetuses are not sentient -- their brains and nervous systems are not yet developed enough for sentience -- and so the motivating moral concern for animals doesn't apply to most abortions[2];
  3. later abortions affecting sentient fetuses, while rare, raise serious moral concerns, but these abortions -- like all abortions -- invariably involve the interests and rights of the pregnant woman, which can make these abortions morally permissible.

For a book claiming to explore the "connections" between debates about the two issues, just the summary from the book flap -- basically, what's above -- makes it appear that there really isn't much connection between the topics, at least at the core ethical level. Animals are sentient, early fetuses are not, and so the moral arguments about the two issues don't overlap or share premises. While the authors hope to use insights from one issue to shed light on the other, I find that differences in the issues limit these insights.

The first part of the book has an introduction and four chapters on ethical, and occasionally legal, issues concerning the treatment of animals and abortion. The second part has three chapters concerning advocacy: what means should and shouldn't activists use to seek their ends? What, if any, graphic visual images should they present? Should they ever use violence? A conclusion mostly addresses controlling animal reproduction.

In chapter 1, "Sentience or Species?" Colb and Dorf propose that sentience is a sufficient condition for moral considerability: their examples of killing male layer chicks (who don't produce eggs and so are worthless to the egg industry) by grinding them up[3] and sticking scissors into a six-month old unborn fetus's skull to kill him, and the apparent pain involved in each, illustrate that actions affecting sentient beings are morally significant. Colb and Dorf propose that inflicting serious harms on sentient beings is morally wrong unless done for a good, justifying reason.

The "pro-life" movement needn't deny this, but it maintains that being human or a "human being" is another sufficient condition for both moral considerability and basic moral rights. Pro-lifers argue that fetuses and embryos are morally considerable and have moral rights from conception or soon after, far before they are sentient. While pro-lifers believe that aborting sentient fetuses is wrong, they claim that aborting non-sentient fetuses is equally wrong.

Colb and Dorf reject the pro-life view, as they present it. They argue that never-been-sentient beings, like early fetuses, lack interests and that there cannot be moral obligations to beings without interests: they cannot be harmed. They also argue that (biologically human) fetuses are not "human beings" and that being human is, in itself, not morally relevant. They tentatively conclude that aborting pre-sentient fetuses is not even prima facie wrong.

Their review of anti-abortion arguments is not comprehensive: e.g., they don't consider arguments that abortion is wrong based on duties concerning, but not to, fetuses, such as duties to future or potential persons. It is also at times weak: e.g., they don't offer an analysis of "human beings" to argue that (human) fetuses are not human beings, and they sometimes waver between humanity and personhood. And, despite their recognition of the value of sentience, they don't emphasize that it is wrong to harm human beings because of their sentience, and so whether fetuses are human beings or not does not, in itself, settle much, contrary to many pro-lifers.

Apart from the limitations of their discussion of abortion ethics, I found it overall odd that the authors offered such a strong judgment on the morality of early abortions, given the book's main goal of using each issue to illuminate the other. It's unclear how saying something like, "Let's see how arguments about abortion and animal rights can help us understand the other topic, even though most abortions aren't wrong," supports the book's overall goal. An understated lesser goal of the book may be to show that those who accept animal rights need not think that early fetuses have rights and that abortion is wrong: there is no inconsistency in that position. While this is true, it is easily understood for those who see that an "if a being is sentient, then it has rights" principle has no logical implications for non-sentient beings, such as early fetuses, plants, bacteria, etc. and are informed that fetal sentience develops later in pregnancy, past when most abortions occur. As Colb observes in her book on veganism[4], one can "favor animal rights for ethical reasons [due to animals' sentience] and favor a woman's right to have an abortion prior to fetal sentience, without any contradiction" (85-86). One might find a "contradiction" here only if one thought a case for animal rights was based on animals being alive, or organisms, or having some other property that early fetuses also possess. But these wouldn't be sentience-based arguments, and these arguments would be very weak since just because something is alive and/or an organism doesn't seem to make it even prima facie wrong to kill it: e.g., plants, microorganisms and many insects, at least.

Chapter 2, "The Necessity Defense," evaluates a common moral justification for aborting sentient fetuses and/or harming animals, namely that doing so is "necessary." Colb and Dorf argue that most harmful uses of animals are not "necessary," and so are wrong: e.g., we don't "need" to eat animals and so, since animals are seriously harmed by being raised and killed to be eaten, doing so is wrong. They argue, on Kantian-like grounds, that animal research is wrong, even if it would profoundly benefit some human beings, because it "instrumentalizes" animals. Nevertheless, they consider harm-animals-or-die cases as "a form of necessity" (59), but one that does not justify seriously harming animals.

Overall, their arguments here would have benefited from an explicit discussion and analysis of "necessity," since whether an action is necessary or not (to bring about what specified end?) does not in itself determine that action's morality. The authors seem sidetracked by whether an action is necessary or not, in usually some unspecified way, instead of focused on the direct question of whether there is adequate moral reason to justify the harms.

This chapter's discussion of abortion isn't focused on whether they are "necessary" or not, but whether they are morally justified in various cases, e.g., to save the life of the woman, pregnancies due to rape and incest, and when disabilities are found in the fetus. I found the discussion here rich, insightful, and valuable, especially on the nature of pregnancy and the fetus-to-mother relation: they characterize pregnancy as "a form of intimate, demanding rescue provided by the woman to her fetus" (72). Their discussion goes well beyond the typical concerns that many philosophers raise about abortion.

Although they were supposedly discussing sentient fetuses in this chapter, that topic (or special concerns related to it) was rarely mentioned: the discussion was usually applicable to abortions at any stage of fetal development. Their discussion was also independent of any insights from animal-ethics theorizing, although they conclude with a "coda" that argues that, while sentient animals are exploited, abortions and embryo experimentation are not a form of exploitation.

In chapter 3, "Reproductive Servitude," Colb and Dorf propose an analogy or connection between the topics to try to gain "insights" into both:

women who seek abortions face circumstances similar to those that confront farmed animals, especially female farmed animals. . . women who are denied the right to have abortions are placed in a kind of reproductive servitude that resembles the reproductive servitude in which dairy cows and laying hens are held. In each case, females' reproductive capacities are used for the benefit of others: abortion prohibitions appropriate the bodies of women for the benefit of fetuses; dairy and egg production appropriate[s] the bodies of cows and hens for the benefit of the people who will eat the dairy and egg products (77).

If a woman was intentionally impregnated against her will, forced to remain pregnant, and then her baby and/or breast milk taken from her and her baby imprisoned (if female) to repeat the cycle or killed (if male) and then she herself killed when infertile, then there would be a highly relevant comparison (as would a case with any of these features). A woman remaining pregnant when she does not want to be because she is prohibited from ending her pregnancy seems highly disanalogous to the experiences of any exploited animals.  Is the comparison supposed to be that the harms to women that result from not allowing access to abortions are similar to the harms female animals (and their offspring?) endure in egg and dairy production? Or that the egg and dairy industries do wrong to female animals (and their offspring?) that is comparable to not allowing women access to abortions? I doubt that many would find such comparisons illuminating for either issue, given the many differences between the cases. The overreach of this analogy also might detract from the insight that, due to the unique exploitation of female farmed animals, veganism, and animal ethics issues generally, should be of special concern to feminists.

Setting this analogy aside, the remainder of the chapter argues that not allowing women to have abortions places them in "reproductive servitude" to fetuses. Judith Jarvis Thomson's famous arguments about abortion are discussed,[5] and arguments are given that the law should continue to allow abortions (as well as harmful animal use, at least until a critical mass of opposing citizens develops). And there is further insightful discussion of the nature of pregnancy and abortion: e.g., is it a positive act of harm (if and when it is harmful), or is it a withholding of a benefit?

Chapter 4, "Death Versus Suffering," argues that killing sentient beings, even if done painlessly, typically harms them: sentient animals and humans experience their lives and killing deprives them of the goods of their lives. This discussion seems directed at those who might think that the only moral concern for animals is not causing them pain, and so painlessly killing animals is morally innocuous. Colb and Dorf forcefully argue that this view is indefensible, challenging views that long-range plans are necessary for a right to life and affirming a better common-sense view that mammals and birds have enough of a stable self that exists over time that even a painless death typically harms them.

Concerning abortion, Colb and Dorf respond here to arguments that since it's wrong to kill human beings when they are not sentient, e.g., when they are sleeping or in comas, it is also wrong to kill non-sentient fetuses. They argue, in a variety of clever and interesting ways, that currently not sentient individuals with past-but-revivable sentience are quite different from those who have never been sentient -- the former remain "someone" when unconscious, but the latter have never been someone yet -- and that this makes a crucial moral difference.

In a just over one-page "coda" to this chapter, Colb and Dorf state that even though they think that abortions of sentient fetuses are often morally wrong, they believe that these abortions should remain legal, since the law needn't criminalize all wrongdoing and such criminalization would burden pregnant women. Colb and Dorf surprisingly never explicitly state when fetuses likely become sentient (medical research suggests around 20 weeks, although Cheryl Abbate argues for 8 weeks, to give fetuses the benefit of the doubt regarding sentience that some invertebrate animals are given[6]) and they don't provide data on how often later-term abortions occur. Most importantly, they don't explain why a near-ban on late term abortions would be genuinely burdensome on women if earlier abortions were readily available, and why these burdens would justify causing potentially horrific pain to a sentient fetus.

The second part of the book, "Movements," discusses issues for advocates concerning strategies, images and violence.

Chapter 5, "Strategy" observes that some animal advocates' strategy to try to help end animal-harmful industries and practices is, for now (and among other tactics), to seek industry reforms to try to lessen certain harms done to animals: e.g., bigger cages, housing that allows socializing, less painful forms of killing, and other change to make animals' lives and deaths more "humane." Other advocates argue that such reforms are counterproductive, that they would not lead to the abolition of any animal-consumptive practices and that any advocacy for animals must include the message that all harmful animal use is morally wrong, not just certain especially painful treatments of animals. While this intra-movement debate strikes me as based mostly on empirical speculations for which nobody has very good evidence, and predictive analogies from other social movements' successes are hard to find, Colb and Dorf argue against reforms as a viable strategy to eliminate harmful animal use.

Analogously, are campaigns to ban later abortions of sentient fetuses attempts to make abortions more "humane," e.g., banning "partial birth" abortions? Do some segments of the pro-life movement see these bans as paving the way for the end of abortion? Do other pro-lifers see these bans as counterproductive, in that people might conclude (mistakenly, in their view) that only later abortions are wrong, not all abortions? Colb and Dorf don't really engage these questions.

However, these types of questions face almost all social movements with complex and challenging goals: do activists try to somehow directly seek now whatever their ideal is, or pursue some less-than-ideal steps along that way, or both? So, again, although abortion and animal movements confront some similar questions, it was unclear how insights from or about either movement should influence thinking about the other. I did, however, appreciate Colb and Dorf's observations that more people would likely be more open to restrictions on abortion than animal use, since prohibiting abortion is unlikely to affect most people's personal lives, whereas, say, a prohibition against killing animals to eat them would have major personal impact for most.

Chapter 6, "Graphic Images," evaluates advocacy using grotesque images of dismembered fetuses and graphic videos documenting violent, abusive treatment of animals in, e.g., slaughterhouses or laboratories. Such images can be informative and motivating, but they can also be misrepresentative and numbing: e.g., people might think that images of aborted late term fetuses are representative of all abortions or that videos document only rare cruelties to animals, and people might feel powerless and overwhelmed in response to seeing the horrific treatments of animals. Colb and Dorf advocate for the rare and selective presentation of animal-abuse visuals, but don't engage any of the attempts at determining, empirically, what kinds of visual presentations are most likely to positively influence most people.[7]

Chapter 7, "Violence," criticizes most violent forms of activism. Colb and Dorf argue that violent strategies are "arbitrary" because, at present, equally good outcomes can be brought about for animals and/or fetuses non-violently. They also observe that the targets of violent activists tend to focus on those who supply abortions or animal products, rather than those who demand these products or services, and so are unlikely to bring about broad change. They observe that segments of the pro-life movement have been far more violent and lethal than any animal advocates, and argue that whereas this violence has likely reduced the availability of abortions, violence done on behalf of animals has had little impact on the overall numbers of animals used. They suggest that, although violence can be justified by its consequences, it's often a complex empirical question whether any particular violence is justified.

In a concluding chapter, Colb and Dorf mostly discuss controlling animal reproduction, not by abortion, but by sterilization. They argue that even though sterilization harms animals by eliminating their sex drives and, mostly for females, their potential for parenthood, sterilization is justified by the fatal consequences of pet overpopulation. They don't propose that other methods of contraception, such as vasectomies and tubal ligations, may be less harmful ways to prevent the existence of unwanted animals and so perhaps should be considered more often.

In sum, like many (bio)ethical topics, abortion and animal rights raise some similar issues and confront some similar challenges. Important differences, however, between all fetuses and pregnant women and all non-human animals make it doubtful that better understanding one set of issues will or should, in itself, provide insight into the other set. Beating Hearts offers many other insights and important arguments about abortion and animal rights, but the issues remain largely distinct and so comprehensive philosophical engagement with both issues, on their own terms, remains essential for moral progress concerning them both.[8]

[1] For a book summary, see Colb and Dorf, "Animal Rights and Abortion: How these Two Debates Illuminate Each Other," The Chronicle Review, The Chronicle of Higher Education. March 13, 2016.

[2] See, e.g., Centers for Disease Control and Prevention, Morbidity and Mortality Weekly Report, "Abortion Surveillance -- United States, 2012," Surveillance Summaries, November 27, 2015 / 64(SS10);1-40: "In 2012, the majority (65.8%) of abortions were performed by ≤8 weeks' gestation, and nearly all (91.4%) were performed by ≤13 weeks' gestation. Few abortions (7.2%) were performed between 14-20 weeks' gestation or at ≥21 weeks' gestation (1.3%)."

[3] Incidentally, while this review was being written, the United Egg Producers announced that it would end this practice by 2020: see, e.g., Karin Brulliard, "Egg Producers Pledge to Stop Grinding Newborn Male Chickens to Death," Washington Post, June 10, 2016.

[5] Thomson, "A Defense of Abortion," Philosophy and Public Affairs 1.1 (1971): 47-66.

[6] Abbate, "Adventures in Moral Consistency: How to Develop an Abortion Ethic through an Animal Rights Framework," Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 18.1 (2015): 145-164.

[7] E.g., Mark Hawthorne's discussion of two studies, "How Do Graphic Images Affect Animal Advocacy?", Striking at the Roots: Animal Activism Around the World (blog), November 1, 2012; and Sabine Doebel, Susan Gabriel, and The Humane League, "Report: Which Farm Animal Photos Are Most Likely To Inspire People To Eat Vegan?"; Humane League Labs (blog), January 2015.

[8] For interesting and helpful discussion of this review, I thank Cheryl Abbate, Andrei Buckareff, Devon Belcher, Bob Fischer, Matt Haltemann, Dan Hooley, Jeff Sebo, and Michael Dorf.