2016.07.17

Peter Carruthers

The Centered Mind: What the Science of Working Memory Shows Us about the Nature of Human Thought

Peter Carruthers, The Centered Mind: What the Science of Working Memory Shows Us about the Nature of Human Thought, Oxford University Press, 2015, 290pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198738824.

Reviewed by Elijah Chudnoff, University of Miami


Sometimes in deciding what to do we reflect. Here is an example:

You've been visiting Berlin, but now it is time to catch your flight home. You want to take public transportation and Google Maps gives you a number of options. Two stand out: U5 > S42 > TXL or S42 > TXL. The first is faster, involves less walking, but requires you to navigate two transfers. The second is slower, involves more walking, but only requires you to navigate one transfer. You know that navigating transfers stresses you out, you prefer avoiding stress to walking less and traveling faster. So you decide to take the second route.

How exactly should we conceive of this and other bits of reflection? Peter Carruthers opens his new book by sketching what he takes to be the answer of common sense and philosophical tradition:

(A) We have various attitudes -- beliefs, desires, goals, preferences, etc -- and reflection is a conscious process of activating some of these -- e.g. the goal to take public transportation to the airport -- for the purposes of reasoning and decision making.

(B) These active bits of reflection are distinctive portions of our streams of consciousness, which also contain passive occurrences -- e.g. the standing out of two among several options on Google Maps.

The rest of the book is dedicated to showing that both (A) and (B) are false and to presenting an alternative view of reflection and the stream of consciousness.

According to Carruthers, (A) is false because only sensory mental states, such as inner verbalizations, episodic memories, and imaginative rehearsals of actions, are conscious. This picture of the relationship between attitudes and consciousness stands in a mutually supportive relation to the views about self-knowledge he defended in his earlier book, The Opacity of Mind: An Integrative Theory of Self-Knowledge, according to which knowledge of one's own attitudes is as indirect and interpretive as knowledge of another's attitudes. Likewise, (B) is false because which verbalizations, memories, and rehearsals are conscious is always the result of decisions on our part about the focus of attention. Carruthers' alternative to (B) is situated in a comprehensive interpretation of the contemporary empirical literature on consciousness, attention, and working memory.

Here is my own rendition of how the overall argument of the book goes. It begins with:

(1) Propositional attitudes are amodal -- i.e. non-sensory.

Carruthers argues for (1) in chapter 2 "Propositional Attitudes," where he also argues that propositional attitudes are structured -- without having to meet Gareth Evans' full Generality Constraint -- and individuated by their functional roles. Carruthers takes his first shot at (B), arguing that the idea that there are active and passive forms of one kind of propositional attitude is in tension with the idea that there is only one functional role individuating that propositional attitude. The argument seems a bit quick to me since a single propositional attitude might be associated with different functional roles only one of which is the individuating role. In defending (1), he persuasively criticizes sensorimotor accounts of propositional attitudes.

Further premises are: 

(2) If a mental state is access conscious, then it is globally broadcast.

(3) Attention works by boosting neural activity in midlevel sensory areas of the brain.

(4) If a mental state is globally broadcast, then it is because it is an object of attention.

Carruthers defends and elaborates on (2) through (4) in chapter 3,"Perception, Attention, and Consciousness." A mental state is globally broadcast just in case it is "generally, or globally, accessible to an extensive set of other cognitive systems, including those for forming memories, issuing in affective reactions, as well as a variety of systems for inference and decision making" (48). The force of (2) is to rule out more demanding notions of access that require availability for verbal report or higher order thought.

Carruthers makes a number of claims about the function and the neural implementation of attention. With respect to function, attention "is what enables the mind to focus its resources on information that is relevant" (59). With respect to neural implementation, attention operates by "biasing sensory processing, enhancing the selectivity of selected groups of neurons and suppressing the activity of others, seemingly by increasing or decreasing the extent to which those neurons fire in phase with one another" (61). He cites studies of spatial attention, attention to motion, and expectations of sounds to support the claim that this biasing is focused on midlevel sensory areas of the brain. Hence (3).

The support for (4) comes from studies of inattentional blindness, neglect, and the results of transcranial magnetic stimulation on those parts of the brain responsible for modulating attention. The kinds of arguments Carruthers provides in favor of (3) and (4) are inferences to the best explanation of currently available experimental results. These kinds of arguments are not unassailable: there are alternative interpretations, worries that the currently available experimental results are inconclusive (e.g. the cited studies are all of sensory attention, so one might worry that (3) does not hold for attention generally), etc. But he does a good job with the materials at hand, and his discussion here is both balanced and prima facie persuasive.

The argument continues:

(5) If a mental state is in working memory, then it is access conscious.

(6) If a mental state is in working memory, then it is because it is an object of attention. [From (2), (4), and (5); also from independent empirical studies]

(7) The mental states that figure in reflection are in a unique workspace -- working memory.

(8) The mental states that figure in reflection depend on neural activity in midlevel sensory areas of the brain. [From (3), (6), and (7)]

Carruthers argues for (5) through (8) in chapter 4, "The Nature of Working Memory," and chapter 5, "The Unity of Working Memory." Working memory is a "workspace in which information can be sustained, rehearsed, and manipulated for the purposes of reasoning and decision making" (75). He adds "conscious" to the description; hence (5). But the case for (5) is strange. Carruthers does not cite studies directly in support of (5). Rather he cites studies that purport to challenge (5) and then gives alternative interpretations of them that are compatible with (5). (5), however, turns out to be inessential to the overall argument. (6) is essential, and it does receive some inferential support from (2), (4), and (5). But Carruthers also cites empirical studies that directly support (6): there are converging neural and behavioral studies correlating working memory capacity with attentional capacity; and there are transcranial magnetic stimulation studies suggesting that interrupting brain regions associated with attention interferes with working memory.

Working memory is just the kind of workspace within which reflection might occur. Suppose it were the only such workspace. Then -- given that working memory depends on attention and attention works by boosting neural activity in midlevel sensory areas of the brain -- the mental states that figure in reflection would themselves, Carruthers reasons, depend on neural activity in midlevel sensory areas of the brain. That is, (8) would follow and reflection would be, as he puts it, "sensory dependent." In chapter 5 he considers the possibility that there is a second, amodal workspace in addition to working memory. He argues that this hypothesis has two consequences -- that we have non-inferential access to our attitudes and that intelligence depends on the capacities of two distinct workspaces -- that turn out to be false. Hence (7), and, Carruthers thinks, the argument for (8) goes through.

There seems to me to be a confusion here though. Contrast (8) and (8*):

(8) The mental states that figure in reflection depend on neural activity in midlevel sensory areas of the brain. [From (3), (6), and (7)]

(8*) The mental states that figure in reflection do so in part because of neural activity in midlevel sensory areas of the brain. [From (3), (6), and (7)]

(8) says that the mental states depend on neural activity in midlevel sensory areas of the brain. (8*) says that the mental states' figuring in reflection depends on neural activity in midlevel sensory areas of the brain. Suppose the mental states that figure in reflection do not essentially do so. Then (8*) might be true without (8) being true. Further, (3), (6), and (7) at most support (8*) not (8). But it is (8) that Carruthers requires for his conclusions, which are:

 (9) Propositional attitudes are not among the mental states that figure in reflection. [From (1) and (8)]

(10) Common sense and philosophical tradition are mistaken in their commitment to (A). [From (9) and the meaning of (A)]

Recall the bit of reflection described above and consider the goal of taking public transportation to the airport. According to common sense and philosophical tradition the goal is consciously present in the bit of reflection. Carruthers denies this. According to him the goal partly shapes the bit of reflection, but remains outside it hidden away in the unconscious. There are two key ways the goal might partly shape the bit of reflection. First, it might help cause there to be a conscious sensory proxy -- e.g. an inner verbalization of "I'd like to take public transportation to the airport." Second, it might help cause that sensory proxy to have a certain representational content -- e.g. a content representing that public transportation to the airport is to be pursued. In general: "attitudes cannot, themselves, figure consciously among the contents of reflection. Rather, they are active in the background, motivating the shifts of attention and mental rehearsals of action that generate the sensory-based contents of reflection and the stream of consciousness" (232).

With respect to (9) there is the worry about the confusion between (8) and (8*). As Carruthers understands the notion, a mental state is amodal just in case it does not depend on neural activity in sensory areas of the brain. If we grant him this understanding, then (9) follows from (1) and (8). But as indicated above, there is reason to think Carruthers' arguments at most support (8*), not (8). And (9) does not follow from (1) and (8*), for a mental state might depend on neural activity in sensory areas of the brain for its being conscious or figuring in reflection while not depending on neural activity in sensory areas of the brain, so long as it is not essentially conscious or figuring in reflection. And presumably our attitudes are neither essentially conscious, nor essentially figuring in reflection.

With respect to (10), a lot depends on what it takes for an amodal attitude to figure in reflection. Consider again the goal of taking public transportation to the airport. Given that it is amodal, what is it for it to figure in reflection? Arguably, it will not do to say that the goal is somehow a part of the process of reflection, since the goal is a state and processes are made up of events. So figuring in reflection plausibly consists in having some representative event be part of the process of reflection. On Carruthers' own view, the goal does have such a representative event -- some contentful visual or aural imagery. What the goal fails to have on his view is an amodal, non-sensory representative. So his idea must be that for an amodal attitude to figure in reflection it must have an amodal representative event be part of the process of reflection. It is hardly clear that this is a commitment of common sense and philosophical tradition, however. So one might doubt that (10) really follows from (9) and the meaning of (A).

Carruthers' argument against (B) is less involved, and I will not go into it in detail. It occurs in chapter 6, "Working Memory in Action," and the basic line of reasoning is this: a mental event is in the stream of consciousness only if it is access conscious; a mental event is access conscious only if it is an object of attention; attending to something is an action; so all portions of the stream of consciousness are active occurrences. According to him, "ideas that appear seemingly from nowhere are really the result of unconscious decisions that resolve conflicts over the direction of attention, or concerning what actions to rehearse" (173). As Carruthers notes, (B) is less central than (A), but a stalwart defender of common sense and philosophical tradition is likely to question whether being the result of the kinds of unconscious decisions Carruthers appeals to is sufficient to make an occurrence active in the relevant sense.

In chapter 7, "Reasoning, Working Memory, and Attitudes," Carruthers relates his views on reflection and the stream of consciousness to the literature on System 1 vs. System 2 reasoning. In chapter 8, "The Evolution of Reflection," he considers the question of why our minds would be structured so that amodal attitudes themselves do not figure in reflection, and argues that evolutionary considerations provide a reasonable explanation of this otherwise surprising design feature.

The Centered Mind falls into a familiar genre: an empirically informed philosopher isolates some bit of common sense and philosophical tradition, argues that science shows it to be mistaken, and warns us that dramatic shifts in our thinking are now required. Bad examples of the genre treat their traditional targets without nuance or charity, describe some areas of empirical research in an impressionistic and haphazard way, and engage in naturalistic banner waving without ever really making clear how the empirical research addresses traditional philosophical concerns.

Carruthers' book is not like this. It is a good example of the genre, meriting careful study from anyone interested in reflection and the stream of consciousness. Carruthers writes clearly and engagingly. He treats his traditional targets with respect. He presents an impressive array of empirical research while both getting into the details and fitting them all into an intelligible order. His aim throughout is to help us better understand the things themselves -- reflection and the stream of consciousness -- not to grind some metaphilosophical axe. Although I am doubtful about Carruthers' main theses, I found reading his book and engaging with his reasoning to be instructive and illuminating.