Michael H. McCarthy offers a new and very important interpretation of the life work of Bernard Lonergan. He presents Lonergan as he understood himself: a man who saw a deep and profound crisis as few did and who was called to respond to that crisis as few could. McCarthy describes his book as "four new essays" which expand upon the argument of his The Crisis of Philosophy. This time he has widened his focus from a crisis in philosophy to a cultural crisis. McCarthy draws upon his extensive reading of Lonergan's works to show how Lonergan came to understand the nature of this broader cultural crisis. He also draws upon the work of many others, most notably Charles Taylor and Hannah Arendt, to add detail, nuance and refinement to Lonergan's own argument. But beyond narrating Lonergan's diagnosis of the crisis of culture, McCarthy also shows "Lonergan's exceptional relevance" for responding "to the cultural situation of late modernity." (vii)
The book is organized into a preface, four lengthy and substantive chapters and an epilogue. The first two chapters are devoted to the nature of the cultural crisis as such. The next two focus on how the crisis poses challenges to religion in general (Catholicism in particular), especially challenges posed by our contemporary age of secularism.
Chapter 1: "The Tangled Knot of Old and New: Lonergan's Project of Critical Appropriation
This chapter lays out the framework of Lonergan's thought, which McCarthy employs in the remaining chapters. He explains Lonergan's theory of culture, what it means for a culture to undergo crisis, and how his analysis of the dynamics of consciousness and conversion provides direction for moving beyond a crisis.
For Lonergan, the proper function of a culture is to secure and communicate the meaning and value of a society's way of life. It accomplishes this through stories, rituals, customs and institutions. When a culture is functioning properly, it not only infuses social cooperation with meaning and purpose, but it also criticizes and revises social practices in response to new circumstances as they arise both internally and externally. A crisis occurs whenever a culture is no longer able to perform its proper function and respond creatively to changing circumstances. Although such crises are great in magnitude, they proceed only gradually. It can take generations if not centuries for all the implications of cultural failure inexorably to work themselves out. Hence it takes people of exceptional discernment to recognize that a cultural crisis is underway and to understand its nature and the possibilities for its resolution.
Lonergan argues that modernity arose when the "classical culture," which once played its role successfully, suffered a breakdown as it encountered challenges to which it was unable to respond. Once classical culture had lost its creative edge, it degenerated into a rearguard action that Lonergan called "classicism." Two of the most important challenges were posed by the rise of modern natural science and modern historical criticism. Modern science introduced new methods of knowing that could not be reconciled with classical epistemological norms. Modern critical history undermined the privileged status of classical culture vis-à-vis its pre-classical predecessors.
Yet Lonergan regarded modernity itself as seriously flawed. "Classical culture has given way to a modern culture, and, I would submit, the crisis of our age is in no small measure the fact that modern culture has not yet reached its maturity." McCarthy shows how Lonergan was already contending with the complexity of this crisis by the time he wrote Insight well before postmodernist critiques of modernity became familiar to the English reading public.
Perhaps most troubling for both classicism and modernity has been the gradual realization that virtually all the truths we hold to be self evident are in fact contingent, not necessary. For classicists and post-moderns alike, this meant the loss of all normativity -- from which the former recoil in horror, while the latter embrace it and rejoice. Yet as McCarthy shows, Lonergan is rather unique in discerning how normativity can emerge out of contingency. The key to this distinctive claim is Lonergan's analysis of how objectivity regarding both fact and value can follow from "reflective insights" which grasp the "virtually unconditioned" basis for the rationality of judgments.
McCarthy spells out in detail how Lonergan's notions of self-appropriation and conversion can form the basis for a critical appropriation of cultural sources. Critical appropriation involves "trying to discern and preserve the truth" in inherited sources, while correcting and undoing the deleterious effects of those same sources. (14) This discernment begins with the hard work of self-appropriation, the "close attention" that, first, traces varying cultural expressions of meaning to their originating sources in acts of consciousness. (54) Second, it traces those acts of consciousness to their origins in the questions to which they respond as answers. While expressions, acts of consciousness, and questions may each be culturally variable, Lonergan's unique contribution came, third, in tracing questions back to their originating and invariant sources in the two most basic human desires: "our unrestricted desire to know the whole of reality, and our equally unrestricted desire to discover and actualize whatever is genuinely good." (141) These desires (or "transcendental notions") are culturally invariant because of their unrestricted orientations, and because all specific cultural contents are constructed in response to them. Criticism arising from these desires is always already operating within and constitutive of each particular culture.
These primordial desires serve to clarify the book’s title. The needed response to the crisis of culture is authenticity -- authenticity both on the part of individuals and of societies. But, as Charles Taylor has pointed out, "authenticity" is a highly ambiguous word in contemporary parlance. McCarthy therefore uses Lonergan's way of clarifying the meaning of authenticity in terms of self-transcendence. At its most primordial level, self-transcendence is the ubiquitous phenomenon of questioning. Every language possesses interrogative forms.
Genuine (as opposed to rhetorical) questions draw the inquirer beyond anything she or he has as yet come to understand, accept, believe or value. Self-transcendence begins with questioning which in turn rises out of the unrestricted desires for knowledge, truth and goodness. Self-transcendence is actualized when the inquirer arrives at understandings, judgments, values and choices that really do satisfy the call of questioning. Authenticity, being true to oneself in Lonergan's sense, means genuinely responding to the questions that one has put to oneself about one's culture.
In this way, Lonergan's method provides a basis for assessing whether or not culturally specific ideas, norms and practices are truly in accord with the desires for knowledge and goodness, or whether some forms of bias or ideology have cut off the self-transcending dynamic of ever further questioning. The self-transcending desires are the penultimate sources of all cultural artifacts, and therefore establish transcultural norms (i.e., raising ever further critical questions) to which cultural creations are answerable.
Yet no matter what its glorious achievements, every culture likewise brings forth unfinished and misshapen ideas, values and practices for which genuine further questions have been cut off. Lonergan used the term "bias" to denote this repression of legitimate further questioning that would criticize and correct flawed cultural meanings and values. He analyzed several different forms of bias (whether unconscious or deliberate) and their deleterious effects.
McCarthy is particularly critical of both modernity and postmodernism for their "reductive" proclivities. Drawing upon Lonergan's analysis of bias, he offers a novel way of charactering reductionism as the tendency "to restrict the range of legitimate inquiry and of epistemic and ontological possibility." (40) Modernity, he says, forms a "tangled knot of insights and oversights, of justified beliefs and prejudices, of moral breakthroughs and breakdowns, of legitimate and despotic exercises of power." (7) (His recurring use of the "tangled knot" image is drawn from Pascal's Pensées.) The challenge posed by the cultural crisis requires finding methods that will sustain "tireless individual and collective efforts to preserve, promote, and augment what is good and to correct or repair what is harmful and broken to give correlative expression, socially, politically, and globally to the transcendental notion of value." (30-31)
Still, it is one thing to discern that unrestricted desires for knowledge and goodness are the sources and norms of meaning and value that are immanent within each and every culture. It is quite another to deliberately adopt and habitually live according to such norms in responding the current cultural crisis. Doing so involves what Lonergan called "conversion" -- intellectual, moral, and religious. The term "conversion" is problematic, as McCarthy acknowledges (311). For Lonergan, conversion is not a mindless surrendering of one's rational faculties to the dogmatic pronouncements of some organization, whether religious, political or financial. Rather, as McCarthy shows, "conversion" in Lonergan's sense goes back to the root meaning of periagoge as Plato portrays it in the Republic. There one is "turned around" from subtle, unacknowledged illusions about oneself, truth, reality and goodness toward a critical appropriation of oneself as one really is, and toward the real world for which one is truly responsible. This involves, first, coming to a sober understanding of the role played by the unrestricted desires in the constitution of oneself and one's cultural inheritances, and then to a deliberate choice to live by faithfully responding to the questions that arise from those dynamic norms. McCarthy offers clear and nuanced explanations of each of the three forms of conversion that Lonergan identified (intellectual, moral and religious), and shows the importance of each for the task of critically appropriating the tangled knot of modernity's cultural inheritances.
In the remainder of the chapter, McCarthy turns to showing how Lonergan modeled critical appropriation with regard to the works of "the vetera" (Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, Aquinas) and "the nova" (the new sciences of nature, the rise of historical consciousness, the philosophical turn to the subject, and the hermeneutical turn to language and meaning). Each of these sections richly summarizes Lonergan's view of their respective "enduring contributions" and "important limitations," while at the same time adding McCarthy's own further contributions.
Chapter 2: Objective Knowing and Authentic Living
McCarthy notes the great irony that at its inception modernity arose filled with exuberant optimism about its superior ability to achieve certitude in knowledge, ethics and politics. Yet now "In the troubled and uneven course of modernity, we have gradually lost confidence in our collective capacity to achieve objective knowledge, to make responsible moral choices, and to lead lives of authenticity and truth." (108)
In this chapter McCarthy delves more deeply into the rise and undoing of modernity. He argues that this loss of confidence is closely linked to the failure to attain a credible account of wholeness -- an account of how the natural world, the human psyche, society and politics, and the divine are intelligibly related to one another. He begins with a summary of how Aristotle's corpus once provided an integrating vision for classical culture. He then thoughtfully engages the principal architects of modern culture -- Galileo, Bacon, Locke, Hume, Romanticism, Hegel, Marx, but especially Descartes, Kant and Darwin -- surveying their attempts and failures to provide a new integrating framework. According to McCarthy, Descartes provides the fundamental new orientation for modernity. His hyperbolic doubt constitutes a "flat rejection" of the vetera (in stark contrast to the critical appropriation of the past that McCarthy finds in Lonergan). His theory of the res cogitans inaugurates a "logical" path from certitude about the mind, to that about God, the external world (res extensa), science, and the new understanding of politics that will "render ourselves the lords and possessors of nature."
Yet Descartes' attempt to connect objective certitude with a holistic view was vitiated from the outset by his mind/body dualism, which left the human psyche ultimately disembodied and disconnected from both a mechanistic universe and from human history and society. Before turning to the efforts of subsequent thinkers to attempt more adequate integral accounts, McCarthy draws upon Lonergan's brief but seminal essay "The Subject" to argue that Descartes' turn to the subject was in fact a truncated turn yielding a truncated account of both the subject and the world. He thereby sets the stage for showing how Lonergan was able to overcome the Cartesian orientation of modernity by means of a more empirical and complete account of the human subject.
McCarthy's treatment of Kant's pivotal role in the precipitating crisis is done with great care and is especially insightful. Kant made modernity face the fact that all human knowledge is mediated and does not consist in any kind of immediate intuition. But McCarthy shows in detail that Kant's account of the mediating process was also truncated, neglecting especially the crucial, pre-categorial role played by questioning. Kant offered a way of overcoming the mind/body dualism (the internal experiences of consciousness were integrated into the phenomenal realm by the temporal form of intuition). Yet he nevertheless introduces "a new type of ontological dualism" which sharply segregates theoretical from moral reason, and which is "never intended to promote human power and happiness." (116)
McCarthy's discussion of the movement from Descartes through the other architects of modernity highlights the fact that there are "essential parts of human reality that we presently tend to exclude or omit" (107. See also 206). He contends that, among other things, modernity's self-understanding of modern science does not adequately "account for the intellectual and spiritual operations at the core of scientific inquiry," (119) and that "we still lack a credible account of how the different parts fit together into an intelligible whole" (130) as well as "a credible philosophy to clarify and justify our existing moral commitments" (173). All of which reflect Charles Taylor's ongoing concern.
In response to the tangled knot of modern culture presented in his historical summary, McCarthy argues that Lonergan's work provides "a comprehensive but nonreductive theory of the polymorphic subject." (142) In explaining Lonergan's theory of the "polymorphic subject," McCarthy goes beyond the cognitional subject for which Lonergan is best known. Real human subjects exercise their self-transcending questioning and knowing in response to the two fundamental desires, but they do so within contexts established by other "concerns" or differentiations of consciousness that situate the subject such as embodied biological subjectivity, aesthetic, artistic, pragmatic, economic, political, dramatic, interpersonal, scientific, scholarly and religious. McCarthy explains how these add nuance and detail to the ways in which authentic self-transcendence can occur and can be betrayed.
In the last half of this chapter McCarthy amplifies the discussion of Lonergan's philosophical framework. He takes up Lonergan's "three questions" (concerning cognition, objectivity, and reality) and shows how the answers Lonergan offers provide the basis for the new, sought-after wholeness. He shows how Lonergan expanded (1) his account of the "polymorphic subject" into (2) a more encompassing, nonreductive account of reality (being) that includes but goes beyond the achievements of modern science, and then (3) an "existential ethics" that honors human dignity while incorporating virtue, happiness and affectivity, and finally (4) an account of the divine which sustains a "critical Christian humanism" that is more inclusive than "exclusive humanism."
McCarthy's account of Lonergan's "existential ethics" is especially illuminating, since what Lonergan himself wrote on the topic is very scant. McCarthy argues that inescapably we depend upon moral sources that are bequeathed to us from the past (including the Enlightenment ideals of independence and autonomy). Yet these moral sources are "the tangled outcome of the uneven passage of human history." (175) Authentic subjectivity is needed to exercise critical appropriation with regard to these moral sources. Since Lonergan's philosophy depends so centrally on an authentic self-knowledge, it is poignant and proper that McCarthy closes the chapter with the remark, that "A comprehensive moral philosophy requires a normative account to our troubled and uneven moral development and frank recognition of the diverse moral sources" as well as "genuine humility and candor" regarding our own individual and collective failures to think and live authentically. This is essential to critical appropriation and self-transcendent authenticity.
Chapter 3: Authentic Faith in a Secular Age
Here McCarthy describes the new forms of critical religious and Christian humanism that Lonergan's work makes possible. He prepares the way for his discussion of this new humanism by explaining, first, how the "exclusive humanism" (Charles Taylor’s phrase) of contemporary secularism contrasts with ancient Greek, medieval and Renaissance humanisms. (230-32; McCarthy adopts the term "exclusive humanism" from Taylor.) He then fashions a creative synthesis of Lonergan's two diverging forms of "secularization" and Taylor's three meanings of "secular." He draws heavily on Taylor's detailed historical analysis of "how we got here," offering a nuanced narrative of the rise and transformation of exclusive humanism from Rousseau and Kant through Hegel, Marx, modern historical criticism, Nietzsche, Darwin, Freud and Camus. McCarthy characterizes exclusive humanism in terms of what Taylor calls "the immanent frame," the common intellectual and moral background of "description, explanation, choice, and action" shared by believers and unbelievers alike "that can be understood without reference to the supernatural or the transcendent" (185). For exclusive humanism, this frame is all there is -- it is closed and self-sufficient.
McCarthy explains how Lonergan calls into question the adequacy of exclusive humanism in two ways. First, it presumes rather than argues for the intellectual completeness of the immanent frame. It assumes that questions, especially in scientific research, have intelligible answers. But it ignores rather than answers the questions as to why the universe is intelligible. "Can it account for its own intelligibility and goodness?" (229) Can the universe be intelligible without an intelligent ground? McCarthy accuses exclusive humanism of being "obscurantist" by ignoring such questions. "Only the uncritical assumption that scientific inquiry is omnicompetent can justify that exclusionary posture." (188)
McCarthy argues that "the reality of the self and its environing world is far richer and deeper" than is adequately comprehended in terms of the immanent frame. By way of contrast, he presents an excellent overview of Lonergan's "alternative cosmology" of "generalized emergent probability." (219-230). Lonergan showed how the methods of modern empirical science -- once stripped of their extrascientific assumptions of exclusive humanism and naturalism -- imply an open-ended, nonreductive, emerging universe which integrates the natural and human domains and is dynamically oriented toward a transcendent reality beyond it.
Second, he challenges whether it is possible to live authentically in a secular age completely within the bounds of exclusive humanism. "Our complex dependence on highly imperfect teachers constitutes an essential crux of the human dilemma . . . we first have to accept their epistemic and moral authority, to assimilate our uneven cultural heritage before we can critically distinguish its genuine merits from it grave limitations." (175-76) Yet compromised principles, self- and other-deception, disrespect for human dignity, violence and evil permeate the "tangled knot" of every culture, including modern secular culture. Their persistence brings despair to the prospect of human efforts to live authentically.
For Lonergan the emergent nature of the universe and human history makes them intrinsically connected to a still higher integration into the unconditional gift of God's unrestricted love. Because it is unconditional, God's love pervades human experiential consciousnesses whether people know it or not, acknowledge it or not, want it or not, have adequate language for describing it or not. Religious authenticity comes out of this religious experience of God's love. Its presence reinforces the desire for self-transcending authenticity, makes people unable to fully rationalize their failures, and strengthens the resolve to overcome biases and try again.
Lonergan's critical religious humanism integrates the healing and strengthening power of the experience of God's love with intellectual and moral authenticity. Far from fleeing from reasoning to seek shelter in faith, this new religious humanism inspires human questioning to seek true answers, and offers some answers of its own to questions that transcend ordinary human means. It also calls forth expanded methods of critical appropriation of culture.
Chapter 4: The Chill Winds of Modernity: The Profound Challenge of Catholic Renewal
McCarthy next focuses on the special problems that the crisis of culture has posed for Roman Catholicism. Lonergan himself used to say that the Roman Catholic Church met the crisis of modern culture by "sitting on top of the pressure cooker for 300 years. Naturally you get an explosion."
Following the pattern of the earlier chapters, McCarthy investigates first the complex history of how the church got to where it is today in order to show how Lonergan's proposed response meets the problems. He argues that from the earliest days of the disciples of Jesus, Roman Catholicism has always been a community beset with internal conflicts as well as saintly exemplars. However at a crucial point the church adopted a defensive stance and became more inward-turning, to the detriment of its mission to communicate God's love to the outer world. McCarthy narrates the historical circumstances that culminated in the crucial moments in this tragic transformation: the Protestant Reformation, the Galileo affair, and the political revolutions that ruptured previous church-state arrangements. Relying on the work of historian Paul Hazard, he cites 1680 as a major turning point in the alienation of intellectuals from Roman Catholicism. He traces the centuries of subsequent developments in the church's defensive responses to these developments, including the development of a "scholastic" style of philosophy and theology that were primarily concerned to prove and defend the faith, rather than to creatively engage the world. This line of development reached low points in the proclamation of the Syllabus of Errors (1864) and the condemnation of Modernism (1907), three years after Lonergan was born. As McCarthy puts it, Lonergan "came of age in the antimodernist era." (271)
McCarthy also surveys the ressourcement work, mainly by French scholars in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, which is a "return" to retrieve insights and inspiration from scriptural and other Christian sources that preceded the defensive inward turn. He shows how the work of these scholars was vindicated when the church initiated the long and difficult work of renewal (aggiornamento). This process of renewal received a powerful impetus from the Second Vatican Ecumenical Council (1962-65). After taking note of the controversies ("continuity" vs. "reform") regarding the interpretation of Vatican II, McCarthy identifies what he regards as the major achievements of the Council.
Lonergan was a student during the period when ressourcement scholarship was just beginning, so it had negligible impact on what he was being taught. Nevertheless, in his thirties Lonergan recognized the need for a major renewal of philosophy and theology that took modern historical method seriously. In his student days he wrote several lengthy unpublished sketches of the sort of thing that would be needed. McCarthy narrates how in his doctoral and early post-graduate studies he undertook a kind of ressourcement of his own, highly original retrievals of Aquinas's articulations of the Christian understandings of freedom, sin, grace and the divine Trinity. But to do this, Lonergan had to go back behind centuries of misinterpretation to retrieve the original genius of Aquinas's anthropology. He discovered that in order to accomplish this, he had to understand human consciousness itself with all the profundity that Aquinas had mustered. He saw how this enabled Aquinas to meet the cultural crisis of his time, but in a context that was largely accepting of Catholicism. Lonergan adopted Aquinas as his role model, but had to face a culture that, finding Catholicism largely wanting, had turned away from it.
Lonergan knew that in order to meet the contemporary crisis of culture, he had to first understand it accurately. In order to do this, he realized that he had to understand both modern science and modern critical historical method better than either its practitioners or its propagandists had. The key to this, he came to realize, lay in the facts about human consciousness that he discovered through his studies of Aquinas.
McCarthy makes the somewhat controversial claim that Vatican II "can serve as a dividing line between two stages in Lonergan's career . . . During and after the council, he reflected deeply on the true meaning of Catholic renewal and published Method in Theology." (265) In fact, Lonergan had been preoccupied with the renewal of philosophy and theology from his student days in the 1930's -- which McCarthy does acknowledge (278) is somewhat at odds with his claim. He originally intended Insight to be a larger work that included theological method -- but had to "round it off" to take up teaching responsibilities at the Gregorian University in Rome. While there is no denying that Lonergan's thought underwent very significant developments after Insight, it does not seem that turning to the problem of Catholic renewal was new.
Be that as it may, Lonergan did explicitly enter into the discussion of the kind of renewal needed in the wake of Vatican II. McCarthy draws attention to Lonergan's important distinction between the "great and the small renewal." (279) The "great renewal" would touch upon every aspect of Catholic Christianity -- worship, family life, contributions to the common good, ministry to those in need, and work for social justice. The "small renewal" would be of philosophy and theology, because of the long-term effect these have on culture, science and scholarship. As McCarthy points out, Lonergan certainly understood himself as standing within the faith tradition of Roman Catholicism, but recognizing that that tradition had to discern how to disentangle the knot that bound the faith too closely to a declining classicist culture. It had to learn how to critically appropriate what was authentic in modern culture without succumbing to its inauthenticities, so as to communicate the message of Christ and the historical church to the new cultural context.
The key to this "small renewal" was the "critical investigation of human interiority" (292) that reveals the structures of consciousness, the primordial desires for knowledge and goodness, and the impact upon them by the unconditional gift of God's love. This is because those conscious dynamics underlie not only the growth of Christian faith, but also the achievements of modern culture, while deviations from them underlie all inauthenticities in culture as well as church.
Hence Lonergan placed religious experience of the gift of God's love and religious conversion at the center of his new method in theology. McCarthy explains how, according to Lonergan, unrestricted being-in-love sublates, but does not replace, the unrestricted desires for knowledge and goodness that lead to authentic cultural criticism and reform. As he puts it, "The religious sublation of concrete human living is neither magical nor mythical. Rather, it is the free, daily, uncertain, and mysterious cooperation of God with sinners in the hard work of redeeming the world." (293) He offers a clear and helpful summary of the components ("functional specialties") of Lonergan's theological method. He shows how this method is designed to nurture the discernment and development of religious experience and conversion, and especially its role in leavening critical research and cultural transformation. He concludes the chapter using Lonergan's method to offer his own critical appraisal of some of the most important ethical and political themes of our time: subjectivity vs. objectivity in ethics, equality vs. hierarchy, the right vs. the good, authority vs. autonomy, virtue, power, and happiness.
McCarthy has spent decades carefully studying Lonergan's extensive corpus. His studies have been deeply enriched by his simultaneous and equally deep engagement with the works of some of the most important twentieth century political thinkers -- notably, Arendt and Taylor. This book's erudition and seriousness is a major contribution to Lonergan scholarship.
 Michael H. McCarthy, The Crisis of Philosophy, (SUNY Press, 1990).
 See Michael H. McCarthy, The Political Humanism of Hannah Arendt, (Lexington Books, 2012).
 Bernard Lonergan, "The Absence of God in Modern Culture," A Second Collection, William F. J. Ryan and Bernard J. Tyrrell, (eds.), (The Westminster Press, 1974), 102.
 Bernard Lonergan, Collection, Frederick E. Crowe and Robert M. Doran, (eds.), Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan volume 4, (University of Toronto Press, 1988), 238.
 McCarthy draws the schema of augmenting and perfecting the old by means of the new (vetera novis augere et perfcere) from Lonergan (Insight, p. 768) who in turn derived it from the encyclical of Pope Leo XIII, Aeterni Patris.
 Bernard Lonergan, A Second Collection, William F. J. Ryan and Bernard J. Tyrrell, (eds.), (The Westminster Press, 1974), 69-86.
 McCarthy returns in Chapter 3 to evaluate Kant's role in the rise of secularism.
 Lonergan posed the "three questions" as follows: What is one doing when one is knowing? (cognitonal theory); Why is doing that [objective] knowing? (epistemology); What does one know when one does that? (metaphysics). See A Second Collection, op. cit., 203. McCarthy provides a careful explication of Lonergan's answers in detail, 142-170.
 Bernard Lonergan, Method in Theology, (Herder and Herder, 1972), 101. It is noteworthy that Lonergan does not adopt the approach of intelligent design theorists, who argue that this or that feature of the natural universe can only be explained by the extrascientific intervention of an Intelligent Designer. For Lonergan it is the question of the intelligibility of the whole, rather than of particular events that is ignored by exclusive humanism.
 A Second Collection, op. cit., 268.