2016.07.25

Arindam Chakrabarti and Ralph Weber (eds.)

Comparative Philosophy without Borders

Arindam Chakrabarti and Ralph Weber (eds.), Comparative Philosophy without Borders, Bloomsbury, 2016, 246pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472576255.

Reviewed by Saranindranath Tagore, National University of Singapore


In their Introduction and Afterword, Arindam Chakrabarti and Ralph Weber present a position according to which the idea of comparative philosophy motivates a compelling meta-thesis. In the closing pages of their masterfully articulated afterword, the idea is communicated through a quotation from Gayatri Spivak:

Perhaps it may be said that our lesson of learning equivalence, practicing equivalence, indexing a small epistemic change or shift, may come to facilitate a world where comparison in extremis will no longer be required. (pp.237-238).

Spivak's point is that once epistemic equivalence is achieved across the regions of comparison the ladder of comparative philosophy can be removed. In other words, the achievement of the equality of epistemes would signal the death of comparative philosophy. It is possible to go beyond this formulation and make the claim, which I am sure many would question, that from the event of this death, philosophy proper would emerge encircling the globe thereby contesting Husserl's and Heidegger's reductive gesture towards the figure of "Europe". For Chakrabarti and Weber, the act of comparison always summons a future wherein a new episteme, philosophy without borders (where epistemic equivalence prevails), is normalized. Thinking comparatively, which the essays in the volume fabulously illustrate, is a necessary practice towards the rendering of this normalization.

Such an achievement decidedly emerges with ethical force. Again, I return to the exemplary craftsmanship with which the volume ends. Spivak makes the point, endorsed by Chakrabati and Weber, "Comparison in extremis is a political gesture when response . . . is denied". (p.237). One can add that the comparative act necessitated by the lack of response is not merely political but more fundamentally an ethical call. Comparison is always designed as an ethical task to elicit a response; and when philosophy is enacted sans borders the comparative would disappear in the textures of a normalized episteme. The volume brings together nine wide-ranging essays touching upon almost all traditions of philosophy globally construed. It engages the reader with framing texts that motivate the essays and simultaneously accomplish the meta-philosophical task of considering the nature of comparative philosophy. The essays can be read as providing grist for the mill towards constructing a world where the discourse of philosophy emerges as truly borderless.

Tom J. F. Tillemans, in "Count Nouns, Mass Nouns, and Translatability: The Case of Tibetan Buddhist Logical Literature", provides a compelling analysis of the use of mass nouns in the Tibetan Buddhist philosophical literature. He links the relevant Buddhist concerns to the Quinean idea of the inscrutability of reference. The discussion somewhat corrects Quine who, in Tilleman's telling, had denied the distinctive usage of mass and count nouns in some Asian languages. These ideas motivate a discussion of whether languages have inherent ontologies and are thus untranslatable or whether natural languages must share a conceptual scheme thereby making them in principle intertranslatable. Along with Quine, Davidson and Whorf are engaged in the Western side of the argument.

Barry Hallens, in "Translation, Interpretation, and Alternative Epistemologies", focuses on the notion of truth in African philosophy, especially as it emerges in the Yoruba tradition. Hallens' discussion fruitfully profiles the Yoruba position that knowledge can only be achieved through "first-hand knowledge" gathered from direct perception. No other source can provide claims that can constitute knowledge. Establishing the Yoruba philosophy of truth where "second-hand experience" is epistemically demoted, Hallen argues that Gettier-type counter-examples would not arise in such an alternative epistemology. This is an interesting result worthy of inclusion in contemporary analytic debates in epistemology.

Chien Hsing Ho, in "Resolving the Ineffability Paradox", journeys through multiple regions of Asian philosophy -- Indian Buddhism, Chinese Buddhism, Hindu philosophy -- to resolve the ineffability paradox. For Ho, the paradox can be simply stated as: how can any utterance be made about the unspeakable without generating a self-contradiction? He develops the idea of expression through indication in order to resolve the paradox. In the course of Ho's discussion, the notion of ineffability receives a wide examination ranging across Chinese and Indian philosophy and should engage contemporary discussions of the ineffable in metaphysics and philosophy of religion. Though the specific target-literature is Asian philosophy, Alston's paper on the ineffable receives some attention as well.

Laurie L. Patton ("The Bowstring is Like a Woman Humming: The Vedic Hymn to the Weapons and the Transformative Properties of Tools") engages the specific question of the cultural meaning of the blessing of weapon, a practice depicted in a Vedic hymn from ancient India. She extends the scope of her initial Indological focus by arguing that tools are not merely instruments but that they have the richer significance of enhancing human agency. By construing the significance of tools as providing "symbols of orientation", Patton is able to admirably link the thought-world of Vedic India to contemporary issues in the philosophy of technology and culture. It should be noted as an aside that the treatment of tools by Heidegger would have resonated well with the central theme of her essay but is given a miss.

Chakrabarti, in "How Do We Read Others' Feelings? Strawson and Zhuangzi Speak to Dharmakirti, Ratnakiri, and Abhinavagupta", confronts the perennial philosophical question of the problem of other minds. After an instructive perusal of the issue as it emerges in Asian philosophy, cutting across the Indian and Chinese traditions, through discussions of the philosophers listed in his title, Chakrabarti proffers a stimulating theory of how the collective "we" is formed through direct perceptual empathy. The profound interventions of Abhinavagupta, the 10th century Indian philosopher, as explained by Chakrabarti, are particularly engrossing. This essay relates well with contemporary discussions in metaphysics of other minds and the perceiving of alterity. Needless to say, these themes would be of interest to philosophers interested in both the Analytic and the Continental traditions. Not unlike the missing Heidegger in the previous essay, including Levinas in the patterns of the argument of this essay would have been of additional value.

Masato Ishida, in "The Geography of Perception: Japanese Philosophy in the External World", develops a realist theory of perception by problematizing the nature of ocular vision through a series of comparative accounts by engaging Japanese philosophers with and Western philosophers. Watsui Tatsurō, Ōmori Shōzō, Nishida Kitarō, Dōgen, Hume, Sartre, and Wittgenstein are just some of the philosophers considered, attesting to the intricate weave that can be disclosed when two distinct traditions are engaged to analyze a single philosophically arresting phenomenon. In this instance, the weave brings together Japanese and Western thinkers exploring a theory of direct perception. Ishida's contribution can engage contemporary discussions of the epistemology of perception.

Weber ("Authority: Of German Rhinos and Chinese Tigers") begins a conversation between phenomenology (Kojève), analytical philosophy (Miranda Fricker), and Chinese philosophy (Han Feize) on the notion of authority within the broader structures of political thought. The essay makes the important point that authority normatively understood "would have to make room for questioning the authority, for arguing and debating with the authority". The nature of authority is of central relevance in political philosophy and its treatment from multiple traditions is most welcome. Weber's essay, partly concerned with Fricker's analysis of epistemic dimensions of justice, bridges the earlier broadly epistemological themes of the collection with the last two essays devoted to political philosophy.

Sari Nusseibeh, in "To Justice with Love", establishes a dialogue between the classic text of Islamic philosophy, Ibn Khaldun's Muqadimmah, and John Rawls's A Theory of Justice in order to argue that the human instinct of love should play a pivotal role in the establishment of the political order. Indeed, the interplay between the emotions and politics, recently showcased in the writings of Martha Nussbaum and featured in Nusseibeh's essay, summons an added layer of significance with the thematic consideration of Ibn Khaldun. Ibn Khaldun's thought, rarely discussed in the recent literature on political philosophy, surely is of lasting relevance for global political theory.

Finally, Sor-hoon Tan, in "Justice and Social Change", provides a nuanced account of a Confucian theory of justice engaging both Confucius and Mencius. In the course of her essay, she presents a conversation between the Chinese and Aristotelean conceptions of justice with the goal of reassessing the idea of distribution as the cornerstone of a theory of justice. Her discussion of Marx is also instructive. Tan's attempt at reconstructing a Confucian perspective on social justice in addressing problems of political philosophy as it emerges in contemporary thought serves as a model for borderless thinking. Indeed, all the essays in the collection, in different ways, are designed to transcend borders, the promise of the book’s is inscribed in the title.

Regrettably, it is beyond the scope of this review to go beyond exegesis of the chapters to provide detailed critical commentary, even though one is tempted to do so in light of the rich intellectual excitement that they spark. It must be said, however, that the essays range over a wide array of philosophical themes. They take into account every single philosophical tradition from around the globe that has contributed to the philosophy of humanity. To shed the qualifier "comparative" is to transcend the provincial and to embrace the universal (human) which is the source of all expressions including philosophy. Chakrabarti and Weber's edited volume goes some distance towards the normalization of this universal and thus is recommended to all readers unconditionally.

Rabindranath Tagore made an observation which remained buried in his voluminous writings till retrieved and emphasized by Amartya Sen in one of his landmark essays that can be quoted to celebrate the spirit of these essays:

"Whatever we understand and enjoy in human products instantly becomes ours, wherever they might have their origin. I am proud of my humanity when I can acknowledge the poets and artists of other countries as my own."[1]

This sense of belonging, transcending but not damaging the local, is much needed in today's philosophical discourse. The editors' careful work in the formation of this anthology, aided by its impressive papers, powerfully reminds us that philosophy as a global tradition in its contemporary manifestation has an important role to play in the constitution and normalization of such a cosmopolitan ethos.


[1] See Amartya Sen, "Tagore and his India" in The Argumentative Indian, (Penguin Books, 2005), p. 119.