2016.08.02

C. P. Ragland

The Will to Reason: Theodicy and Freedom in Descartes

C. P. Ragland, The Will to Reason: Theodicy and Freedom in Descartes, Oxford University Press, 2016, 255pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190264451.

Reviewed by David Cunning, University of Iowa


There is much to admire in C. P. Ragland's book.  He takes on a series of overarching aims: among them, to highlight the respects in which Descartes's corpus is a record of the struggle of human reason to resolve critical antinomies, including an antinomy surrounding free will and divine preordination (40-41, 231-235); to defend an interpretation according to which Descartes holds that free will is a matter of being unconstrained by influences external to the mind (103); to argue that in cases of clear and distinct perception the will is free in that it is not constrained by influences external to the mind, but nonetheless it is not able to refrain from affirming its object (6, 137-140); to argue that in cases that fall short of clear and distinct perception, the will has a libertarian two-way power of self-initiated activity by which it can affirm or deny its object (160-166); to argue that Descartes' philosophical views on God and divine providence commit him to saying that all human volitions are determined (220-229); and to conclude that one of the antinomies of Reason that Descartes leaves unresolved in his system is the conflict between divine providence and libertarian freedom (230-235). Ragland ends by framing a very serious concern. Reason delivers the result that human beings in some instances have a libertarian two-way ability to do otherwise, and Reason also delivers the result that human volitions cannot happen otherwise than they do. Descartes accepts the conjunction of these two results, but only by appealing to a principle of divine incomprehensibility that puts pressure on much of the rest of his system. For example, if it is somehow true that God has preordained everything from eternity at the same time that we are free, it might also be true that God is supremely benevolent and not a deceiver at the same time that we are mistaken with respect to our most clear and distinct perceptions (232-234).

There are a number of impressive arguments and discussions. For example, Ragland offers important critiques (84-96) of two prominent readings of the famous vel potius passage in the Fourth Meditation. Descartes claims there that freedom of will "consists simply in our ability to do or not do something," but then he adds straightaway: "or rather [vel potius], it consists simply in the fact that when the intellect puts forward something for affirmation or denial or pursuit or avoidance, our inclinations are such that we do not feel we are determined by any external force" (CSM 2:40). Ragland engages in an impressive discussion of what he calls the Retraction reading and the Expansion reading. He argues that Descartes is not intending to reject the claim that freedom of will consists simply in our ability to do or not do, nor is Descartes attempting to add to that claim. For Ragland, Descartes' commitment to the view that the will consists in our ability to do or not do is unwavering, and his follow-up claim is just an unpacking of one of the important details of that ability. One of the central aspects of Cartesian ability to do or not do, according to Ragland, is the will's independence of influences that are external to the mind, or at the very least an experience of independence that accompanies the will's free activity.

Ragland also offers a compelling defense of the view that, considerations of divine providence aside, Descartes' view of human freedom is consistent. Indeed, Descartes makes a number of claims about freedom that together might give us pause. He says that the will is more free to the extent that it is inclined by reasons and that "If I always saw clearly what was true and good, I should never have to deliberate about the right judgment or choice; in that case, although I should be wholly free, it would be impossible for me ever to be in a state of indifference" (CSM 2:40). Here Descartes is juxtaposing freedom and indifference in such a way as to suggest that to the extent that an affirmation is uncompelled it is unfree. However, Descartes also wants to say that we are free insofar as we have the ability to refrain from affirming confusion and falsehood. A central part of his theodicy is the reminder that if "I refrain from making a judgement in cases where I do not perceive the truth with sufficient clarity and distinctness, then it is clear that I am behaving correctly and avoiding error. But if in such cases I either affirm or deny, then I am not using my free will correctly" (CSM 2:41).

Descartes might then appear to hold that we are fully free just in those instances in which we are affirming a clear and distinct perception, and that we are also exercising our freedom fully when the object of our perception is a confusion on which we suspend judgment. Ragland dissolves the tension here by arguing that Descartes has a hybrid view of freedom according to which the human will sometimes has a libertarian two-way ability to do otherwise and sometimes does not (160-166). But Ragland is not thereby arguing that Descartes proposes a disjunctive account of human freedom or that Descartes takes freedom to have a bifurcated nature. What all cases of Cartesian freedom have in common, Ragland argues, is that free volitions are not caused by anything external to the intellect (102-105). In cases of clear and distinct perception, the will cannot but affirm the object of its perception, but its affirmation is not produced by anything external to the intellect. In cases that fall short of clear and distinct perception, the will has a libertarian two-way power, and its affirmations are not produced by anything external to the intellect either. Another impressive aspect of Ragland's work here is his careful and thorough treatment of the passages in the letters to Guillaume Gibieuf and Denis Mesland in which Descartes discusses freedom. Ragland shows how it is possible to read these as making room for a libertarian two-way power.

Ragland also presents a very compelling defense of the view that Descartes holds that God has preordained all things from eternity -- human volitions included -- and that these cannot take place other than they do. Ragland writes, "On Descartes' picture, creatures may not be puppets, but they certainly seem like robots, merely acting out a program that God wrote . . . . Suppose that God makes true the following [counterfactual conditional]: 'If Adam were placed in the Garden, he would eat the fruit.' Suppose further that God places Adam in the garden. These two suppositions logically entail that Adam will eat the fruit. So even if Adam's action is causally undetermined, it is still a logical consequence of God's activity . . . . Adam's action follows inevitably from factors beyond his control, and hence is not free in the libertarian sense" (221). Ragland includes a thorough discussion of the attempts by some of Descartes' predecessors to avoid this latter result -- mainly from the Jesuit and Dominican traditions -- and he also provides a thorough discussion of the subtle moves by which Descartes differentiates his own view from these. The Cartesian God does not cause our volitions (206), Ragland argues, but it is still a logical consequence of what the Cartesian God does do that we do not possess a libertarian two-way power to do otherwise. He then points to passages where Descartes identifies cases in which we perceive two truths separately, but do not understand how both could be true together (222-229). We should not make any affirmations about what we do not understand, Descartes thinks, and in particular we should refrain from affirming that it is impossible for both perceptions to be true together.

Some of the potential problems for Ragland arise in the evidence that he provides for the view that the will in some instances has a libertarian two-power to do otherwise. One piece of evidence that Ragland provides is from Descartes' Principles I.41 claim that our experience of freedom and independence is in conflict with the clearly and distinctly perceived result that God has preordained all events from eternity. Ragland argues that Descartes cannot have in mind a compatibilist conception of freedom in Principles I.41 because there is no difficulty at all in understanding how we could be free in a compatibilist sense if God has preordained everything from eternity. Instead, a compatibilist view of freedom and divine preordination go hand in hand (208). Ragland concludes that the sort of freedom that Descartes must have in mind is the libertarian sort in which the will is (at least sometimes) in possession of a two-way ability to do otherwise.

A problem for Ragland's argumentation here is that Descartes does not say in Principles I.41 that our freedom is inconsistent with divine preordination, but that it is difficult to make sense of our experience of indifference and freedom if God has preordained everything from eternity. It is perplexing indeed why we would have an experience of independence and indifference if God has preordained all of our volitions for eternity. But there is no contradiction that thereby arises; there is just something that is very puzzling and that we do not at all understand. Descartes does not speak anywhere in his corpus of a clear and distinct perception of a libertarian power that is possessed by a finite will; he speaks instead of an "independence which we experience in ourselves, and which suffices to make our actions praiseworthy or blameworthy, [and which] is not incompatible with a dependence of quite another kind, whereby all things are subject to God" (CSMK 277; also Ragland, 212). There is no doubt that our experience of freedom is mysterious if God has preordained everything from eternity, but that is not say that that God has created us with a libertarian two-way power at the same time that our volitions could not be otherwise.

Another piece of evidence that Ragland offers for his hybrid libertarian reading of Descartes on human freedom is that Descartes says that it is with respect to freedom that human beings most resemble God (84, 100-106). The central passage is in the Fourth Meditation: "it is above all in virtue of the will that I understand myself to bear in some way the image and likeness of God" (CSM 2:40). Ragland of course appreciates that Descartes holds that there are ways in which human wills do not resemble the divine will: for example, our wills do not have the same power and efficacy; and our wills are compelled to affirm truth that has already been established, but when God affirms something to be true, He thereby makes it true. Ragland accordingly zeroes in on a remaining aspect of God's will -- that it acts by a libertarian two-way power -- and he cites a number of texts for support.

A worry, however, is that the texts do not quite support the view that Descartes' God has a libertarian two-way ability to do otherwise. Ragland cites the 1648 Arnauld letter in which Descartes says that "I do not think that we should ever say of anything that it cannot be brought about by God. For since every basis of truth depends on his omnipotence, I would not dare to say that God cannot make a mountain without a valley, or bring it about that 1 and 2 are not 3" (CSMK 358-9); the 1644 Mesland letter in which Descartes says that "God cannot have been determined to make it true that contradictories cannot be true together, and therefore . . . he could have done the opposite" (CSMK 235); and the early Mersenne letter (1630) in which Descartes says that God was free in his creation of the eternal truths (CSMK 25). As has been discussed in the literature, for example in Nelson 1993, Bennett 1994, Nelson and Cunning 1999, and in subsequent work, none of these passages is on its own evidence that Descartes holds that God has a libertarian two-way ability to do otherwise. Descartes makes claims to the effect that we ought not say that God cannot make a mountain without a valley, but strictly speaking these are claims about us and what we ought not say. He appears to be reiterating the point in the 1644 Mesland letter: he does at first make the claim that God can do anything and hence that He can make contradictories true together, but he then retracts the claim and says that it ought not be put forward at all. And he says why: "But if we would know the immensity of his power we should not put these thoughts before our minds, nor should we conceive any precedence or priority between his intellect and his will; the idea which we have of God teaches us that there is in him only a single activity, entirely simple and entirely pure" (CSMK 235). The suggestion that Descartes is making in his retraction of the claim that God can make contradictories true together is that a being that exhibits a single, eternal, and simple activity is a being that does not deliberate or change its course. It wills that contradictories cannot be true together, and it wills this immutably and for eternity. Ragland does mention in a brief discussion that perhaps the freedom of Descartes' God just amounts to God's complete independence from non-divine influences, where God's activity is still internally necessitated, along the lines of the God of Spinoza (164). A longer discussion here would have been welcome, incorporating the work of Nelson and Bennett and also the recent argumentation in Lennon, and then explaining how the similarity of our will to the will of God so understood would entail that, in cases that fall short of clear and distinct perception, finite minds are in possession of a libertarian two-way ability to affirm or deny.

The lack of a sustained discussion of the nature of divine freedom also has implications for Ragland's speculation at the end of the book (220-235) as to why Descartes might be willing to accept the contradiction that God has preordained everything from eternity and that finite wills have a libertarian two-way ability to do otherwise. The reason, Ragland argues, is that Descartes is already committed to the doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths, and that doctrine entails that God's omnipotence and libertarian two-way power are such that He can make contradictories true together. We might bracket the concern that Descartes does not hold that we have a clear and distinct perception of the libertarian freedom of finite wills, but without a more sustained discussion of his view on the nature of divine freedom it also isn't clear that he supposes God has the two-way ability to will the truth of a contradiction.

Another piece of evidence that Ragland offers for his hybrid libertarian reading of Cartesian freedom is the Principles I.37 claim that human beings are different from animals in that we act voluntarily and merit praise and blame for what we do. Descartes writes, "it is a supreme perfection in man that he acts voluntarily, that is, freely; this makes him in a special way the author of his actions and deserving of praise for what he does. We do not praise automatons for accurately producing all the movements they were designed to perform . . . when we embrace the truth, our doing so voluntarily is much more to our credit than would be the case if we could not do otherwise" (CSM 1:205). This is a very important passage, and to anyone with libertarian leanings, it is extremely suggestive. But it poses some potential problems for Ragland.

Descartes says that our embrace of the truth is voluntary and to our credit, but he also holds (or at least Ragland grants that he holds) that we cannot refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception. Ragland allows that we can refrain from affirming a perception when it is no longer clear and distinct, but so long as what we are having is a clear and distinct perception, we cannot refrain from affirming it. In that case Descartes would appear to hold that affirmations of clear and distinct perceptions are to our credit and merit praise even if those affirmations are not due to the exercise of a libertarian two-way power. Perhaps there is a philosophical concern, however, that volitions cannot be said to be praiseworthy if they could not be otherwise, and surely Descartes would have had this concern in mind (Ragland, 61-62, 77-78). However, we might present the same concern back to the libertarian: if a volition is a modification of a mental substance, and it materializes in that substance without a prior modification as its cause, volitions would seem to pop into existence from nowhere, and the will instead would be a loose cannon. Ragland does call attention to the language at the end of the Principles I.37 passage -- which reads that our affirmations of truth are more to our credit than if we could not do otherwise -- but again Descartes holds that we cannot help but affirm our clear and distinct perceptions (of truth), and the Latin does not actually force the CSM translation. The Latin -- ". . . quam si non possemus non amplecti" -- could also be translated to read -- ". . . than if we were not able to not embrace it." This language is similar to the language in the Fourth Meditation, where Descartes asserts that "the will consists simply in our ability to do or not do something" (CSM 2:40), but Descartes is not speaking of a libertarian two-way power in either text if he holds that the will consists in an ability to do or not do and if he holds that the will cannot refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception. The will either affirms or it does not affirm, but that does not mean that it has a libertarian two-way power. Descartes does equate freedom with voluntariness, adding that the will has a "real and positive power" (CSMK 234; Ragland, 125-26), and in the Principles I.37 passage he might just be positioning himself in the tradition of Leibniz and other philosophers who suppose that a large part of what it is for a piece of behavior to be free is for it to be the product of a volition.

Another argument that Ragland offers for the view that Descartes holds that we sometimes possess a libertarian two-way power is that we have to have such a power: if God created us in such a way that we are determined to will as we do, then we would not be able to avoid error, and Descartes' theodicy would be hopeless (77-81, 234). This is a very compelling argument. Perhaps everything here rides on the extent to which we are prepared to allow Descartes' view of divine preordination to serve as a guide to the interpretation of other parts his corpus. If we suppose that Descartes took the view to be a pillar of his philosophical system, and a view to which his other commitments would have to be sensitive, then we would need to read differently from Ragland the Fourth Meditation claim that "I must not complain that the forming of those acts of will or judgements in which I go wrong happens with God's concurrence. For as far as these acts depend on God, they are wholly true and good" (CSM 2:42; Ragland, 62-64). We might add into the mix Descartes' claim to Elisabeth that "philosophy by itself is able to discover that the slightest thought could not enter into a person's mind without God's willing, and having willed from all eternity, that it should so enter" (CSMK 272) and conclude that Descartes has in mind a more Spinozistic resolution of the puzzle of human error: there is a perspective from which our not-clear-and-distinct affirmations are just incomplete and partial representations of truth, where only God is able to see the whole. But the Fourth Meditation certainly does not go to great lengths to encourage this interpretation, and Ragland is right that if we bracket Descartes' view that God has willed our volitions for all eternity, there are other interpretations of his theodicy that would seem to be more natural. As we have seen, there are many aspects of Descartes' thinking that are easy to square with the view that God has preordained everything from eternity: another is his claim to Gassendi that the affirmations of the will are not in every case determined by the perceptions of the intellect (CSM 2:259-60; Ragland, 145-46), where Descartes is not ruling out that affirmations of will might be determined in some other way instead. The suggestion that Descartes opts for a Spinozistic approach to the reconciliation of human error and divine preordination is perhaps more strained.

There is much of interest in The Will to Reason. A central issue is whether or not to assemble Descartes' view of human freedom before or after a consideration of his philosophical views on divine providence. Ragland is correct that if Descartes allows for libertarian freedom, he also makes room in his system for trouble that it could do without.