Gwen Bradford


Gwen Bradford, Achievement, Oxford University Press, 2015, 203pp., $49.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780198714026.

Reviewed by Nomy Arpaly, Brown University

It is rather curious that philosophers haven't written more about achievement. People who write philosophy books tend to treat their books as achievements, think of themselves as high-achieving or low-achieving, and be struck by such achievement-related diseases as perfectionism and competitiveness. Yet, though we have written about things that are often achievements, this is the first philosophy book I am reading about achievement per se.

It is even more curious because of the ubiquity of concern with achievement among people in general. America might be remarkable in its obsession with "success", but psychologists tell us that humans in general, not only ambitious ones, seem to need, if they are to be happy, to have missions in their lives that can be accomplished by them but are not easy for them. To take a few steps back: philosophers, famously, have often concerned themselves with the question of the good life. We disagree about the ingredients of such a life, and yet over the centuries, we seem to have come up with a "usual suspects" list -- some things that we think are surely valuable and which are probably ingredients of the good life. Pleasure, for example, is often deemed valuable, as are loving relationships of various kinds, knowledge (or truth, or wisdom) and so on. Each item among the "usual suspects" had books written about it.

Achievement is rarely mentioned as an item that should be on the list, and as I have said, has not been thoroughly investigated as such. Yet, when people talk about things in their lives that they are proud of, or that give them meaning, or when people talk about things in the lives of others that they admire or envy, achievements are mentioned quite often -- things like professional success, having run a marathon, having raised children to be good people, having written a dissertation, etc. Now some of these things are valuable in more than one way -- for example, writing a dissertation ideally leads to knowledge, one of the ancient "usual suspect" values -- but one thing we value about them is their being achievements. For example, the person who is proud of having written a dissertation isn't just proud of the knowledge she acquired, but of the fact that she actually obtained that knowledge, and presented it well, even though it took a lot of effort on her part. There is an extra value to having actually written a dissertation -- a value that isn't there in gaining the same amount of knowledge through a magic pill, say. This extra value is the value of having achieved something. Some things are valuable only (or almost only) qua achievements. For example, there is little that is intrinsically valuable in standing at the top of a very high mountain. On some occasions, though, there is a great value to a person in having climbed to that top, and it seems to be greater the harder the climb was. This value cannot be captured by simple talk about satisfying desires (what is it that we desire when we want to climb mountains?) or about reaching goals and promoting ends (not every attainment of a goal deserves to be called an achievement). Bradford's book is a new thing: a thorough philosophical investigation of achievement and what makes it valuable. Though her account of the value of achievement situates it nicely within an existing framework -- virtue ethics and perfectionistic ethics - it is still a flat out original contribution to the relevant area of philosophy.

Bradford is quite good at building the case for her view, step by step. I will not follow the process, but let me sketch the view itself. For Bradford, an achievement involves a process and a product such that the process competently causes the product ("competently" implies the involvement of an agent), and such that the process is difficult. This is a clumsy formulation, but Bradford makes her meaning clear: an achievement is when an agent competently brings something about in the face of marked difficulty, where "competently" means, approximately, "knowing what he's doing". Bradford delves into the nature of competence and the nature of difficulty, providing an account of the latter that is based on the idea of effort -- difficult tasks are ones that require effort. To explain the value of achievement Bradford appeals to a venerable idea -- namely, that a good life involves excellent exercises of capacities that are unique to humans and make them what they are. It is an old idea, which Bradford accepts, that the ability to be rational or respond to reasons is one such major capacity. Bradford takes another capacity to be equally important -- one that's discussed by philosophers but usually in a different context altogether, as it has a Kantian air about it. This is the capacity to exercise the will. The two capacities together make a lot of what is impressive about being human. Since achievement requires doing something difficult, which means something effortful, achievement requires the exercise of will. Since achievement requires competent causing of the thing achieved, it requires exercise of rationality or the ability to respond to reasons. Furthermore, in achievement, the two capacities are exercised in concert to form an organic unity which is more valuable than the sum of its parts (e.g you cannot, other things being equal, replicate the value of achievement by doing one thing that requires the same amount of will followed by one different thing that requires the same amount of rationality).

The concept of difficulty is central to Bradford's project, and I would like to bring up some queries about her account of the difficult and how it fits with the final view she defends. Rather intuitively, Bradford holds that things that are difficult to bring about are things that it takes a lot of effort to bring about. She also holds that achievements are all difficult. She then has to face the putative counterexample of the violin virtuoso who plays a technically next-to-impossible piece of music, displaying technical perfection -- and not much effort. It is not unreasonable to suspect that such a performance, even if effortless, is still difficult, and it also seems to be an achievement. On the first question, Bradford considers the view that requiring effort is not the only kind of difficulty a task can have. Perhaps performing the musical piece in question is a difficult task because of its sheer complexity. Bradford rejects this view, pointing out that competent language use is exceedingly complex. It is complex, and yet for an ordinary native speaker it is easy -- because it does not require effort. Because it is easy, nobody regards it as an achievement (except in a trivial "lower case" sense of the word). Playing the complex piece of music is different from competent language use in being difficult -- that is, requiring a lot of effort -- for most people, most violinists, and even for most excellent violinists. Hence our tendency to congratulate a person who has mastered the piece on having achieved something.

What, then, of the virtuoso for whom mere technical complexity in a piece of music does not entail a need for effort? Bradford says that there is a legitimate way in which attributing difficulty and achievement are context-dependent. Playing the piece can be difficult in general (that is, for the contextually clear reference class of violinists) but not difficult for the virtuoso. Accordingly, his performance can be described as an achievement in some contexts, but in others it's acknowledged that for him, it is nothing to write home about: perhaps having become a virtuoso had been a major achievement, but at the point at which he is performing the piece, he is only doing something that he can "do on his head". All of this seems workable.

Later in the book, however, things might get a bit more tangled. Achievement, says Bradford, is valuable because it's an organic unity of exercise of rationality and exercise of will, where will is there because of the need for effort. Imagine, then, an excellent poet who seems to write incredible short poems in outbursts of inspiration that do not seem to be "willed" or require effort in an ordinary sense. Not all poets write like that, but some do, and unlike the virtuoso they don't even practice much -- let us assume, as the stereotype goes, that they just read poetry and literature, which is not a hardship for them, and maybe stare at Greek urns; they might live with tormented minds, but that is a different kind of hardship from making effort. Bradford seems to think that aesthetic achievements do involve exercise of rationality in a broad sense -- one responds to reasons, in this case perhaps aesthetic considerations. If so, I agree with her. However, it seems that the will component is missing in the poet's writing: she does not use anything like will power in order to write her poems. On Bradford's definitions, writing cannot even be difficult for her. Are none of this poet's poems achievements for her? Bradford can say that such a person's poem can be regarded as an achievement when considered as something that the great majority of writers would need a lot of effort to pull off -- perhaps more than most humans are capable of. However, isn't the value of achievement about actual exercise of will (and rationality), and not about merely doing something that would require effort in most relevant people? I wonder if Bradford's view has the resources to handle this problem.

Another area where things might get tangled has to do with the nature of competently causing something. (I prefer "competently bringing it about", but this is not a work on causation and Bradford is allowed to speak as she does. She is also allowed, to a considerable extent, to leave major questions about causation and evil demons to those who work on them). To competently bring about something you need to "know what you are doing", colloquially speaking - at least to some extent. Strictly speaking, Bradford doesn't think knowledge is required -- she has a justified true beliefs-based view of competence, though she is open in principle to the possibility that something like "know how" can provide an alternative base for it. I'll mention just one major query I have here. First, Bradford seems to think that one is more competent at an activity the more justified true beliefs he has about the activity, subject to some constraints of relevance that she discusses. However, even with these relevance constraints, she seems to accept that a person who has a good theoretical understanding of the working of a car is a more competent driver than she would otherwise be. Perhaps this is true with the sort of understanding that makes you a good mechanic (I am not sure of that either -- a good mechanic and a good driver would not be the same thing, but let's say it is true). One can still ask: does in-depth theoretical understanding of the workings of internal combustion, beyond the amount required to be a good mechanic, increase a driver's competence? Bradford gives tying shoelaces as an example of an activity about which there isn't much to understand, but anyone who tries to explain how to tie one's shoelaces without using hand gestures or visual illustrations will notice that in a sense, it's actually pretty complicated -- it's just that the amount of understanding required to be competent in doing it is pretty small. Competence is surprisingly hard to define and Bradford's discussion could have used some rounding off.

Bradford thinks very lucidly, showing poise in the face of objections and conceptual messes. She also writes, most of the time, with admirable clarity, though sometimes so colloquially that some readers might be rubbed the wrong way (I'm referring to things like using the verb phrase "to go Kantian" for "to adopt a Kantian view"). I myself tend to enjoy the casual style. However -- for the information of the people in charge at Oxford University Press -- the book is abysmally copyedited, if it's copyedited at all. I am not saying that the editor should have been particularly proactive, but he or she should have questioned the following:

"held by both philosophers and non-philosophers alike" (my italics)

"the value of exercising the will is just as valuable as exercise of rationality" (my italics. Bradford clearly means "exercising the will is as valuable as exercising rationality").

"In spite of all this, Jones has struggled and fought, and in spite of all these obstacles, he has produced his novel, equally as good as Smith's" (my italics again).

One can obviously criticize Bradford for lapses of writing, but in my opinion, the blame here is shared between her and the copyeditor who did not do his or her expected job -- the right query in the margin would have made all the difference.

All in all, though, this book is a welcome contribution to the philosophical discussion of value in human life. I hope it has a refreshing effect on it.