2016.11.11

Elizabeth Barnes

The Minority Body: A Theory of Disability

Elizabeth Barnes, The Minority Body: A Theory of Disability, Oxford University Press, 2016, 200pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732587.

Reviewed by Stephen M. Campbell, Bentley University, and Joseph A. Stramondo, San Diego State University


Ask random people on the street what their greatest fears are, and disability is likely to appear high on their list -- right up there with death and public speaking. Most people, and perhaps most philosophers, assume that having a disability is virtually always harmful and bad for those who are disabled, and that this is not simply due to such things as prejudice and discrimination, social ostracism, or lack of accommodations. This is the dominant contemporary view about the relationship between disability and well-being, and Elizabeth Barnes is here to tell us that it is mistaken. In her engaging, powerfully argued, and good-humored book, Barnes seeks to illuminate the nature of physical disability, challenge the view that it has a negative impact on well-being, and defend a "mere-difference view" of disability.[1] Being disabled, like being gay or being male, is not in itself something that makes people's lives go worse for them. It is a way of having a minority body. In what follows, we offer partial overviews of each chapter and raise a few worries.

Chapter 1 delves into the metaphysics of disability. Barnes seeks an account of the nature of disability that (i) delivers correct verdicts for paradigm cases, (ii) doesn't prejudge normative issues, (iii) is unifying or explanatory, and (iv) is not circular (10-13). After surveying some competing accounts that she persuasively argues do not satisfy these criteria, she proposes "a moderate social constructionism." As a first approximation, the view is that "disability just is whatever the disability rights movement is promoting justice for" (43). Rightly, Barnes worries that this formulation of the view is "too simple to work," partly because the disability rights movement may sometimes make faulty judgments about what counts as a disability "for all sorts of reasons (prejudice, stigma, misinformation) that ought to be orthogonal to whether such conditions are in fact disabilities" (44-45). Barnes' solution is to appeal not to the actual judgments of the disability community but to the rules governing those judgments. The final formulation of her social constructionist model states: A person, S, is physically disabled in a context, C, if and only if

(i) S is in some bodily state x
(ii) The rules for making judgements about solidarity employed by the disability rights movement classify x in context C as among the physical conditions that they are seeking to promote justice for. (46)

Chapter 2 lays out the most important distinction of Barnes' book: bad-difference views and mere-difference views. To get a grip on this distinction, imagine a social context where disabled people are fully respected as equals, have ideal accommodations, and are not subjected to prejudice, stigma, unwarranted pity, and so on. Call this an "ableism-free society." Bad-difference views claim that, even in an ableism-free society, there will be "a negative connection between disability and well-being" (69, 71). More precisely, these views appear to be unified by their commitment to the following claim:

Bad-Difference: In social contexts where people are fully accepting of disabled people and there is no ableism, having a disability either has or is likely to have a negative impact on the well-being of anyone who is disabled.

In the course of her discussion, Barnes highlights various ways of interpreting "negative impact." We'll discuss three. First, it might be thought that having a disability is always "an automatic or intrinsic cost" to a person's well-being (60-62). In the language typically employed in the well-being literature, this is the idea that having a disability is basically ("non-derivatively," "non-instrumentally," "intrinsically") bad for disabled people. In other words, it is bad for them in and of itself, apart from its consequences and apart from whatever else it might be combined with. Second, one might think that, even in ableism-free environments, disability is likely to have contributory badness, which involves being part of larger wholes that are basically bad for a person. This addresses the case of the desire-fulfillment theorist who thinks that, while disability isn't basically bad on its own, it is strongly correlated with the frustration of desires (59, 63). (The larger wholes, on this view, are combinations of desires and the states of affairs that frustrate those desires.) Third, one might think that, even in non-ableist contexts, disability is likely to be instrumentally bad -- that is, it is likely to lead to more basic bads and/or prevent more basic goods than it leads to basics goods and prevents basic bads. Barnes' example here is a hedonist who thinks that only pleasures and pains are basically good and bad, and who holds the further belief that, absent ableism, disabilities are likely to lead to more negative than positive mental states (59).

Mere-difference views of disability hold that both bad-difference views and the corresponding "good-difference" views are false. Hence, mere-difference views imply that we simply cannot say in general that, in the absence of ableism, disability is likely to be bad for people or good for people. Don't be fooled by the name, however. Calling disability a "mere difference" might sound as if disability has no effect on well-being whatsoever. Importantly, this need not be the case. (Indeed, as we argue elsewhere, we think this is virtually never the case.[2]) The key commitment of mere-difference views leaves open several possibilities regarding disability's impact on well-being.

So, what is the relationship between disability and well-being? In Chapter 3, Barnes presents and defends the Value-Neutral Model of disability. This is a two-part view. The first part can be stated concisely: disability is "neutral simpliciter with respect to well-being." As we interpret her, this is an alternative way of characterizing the idea of basic prudential value. So, disability is a basically neutral trait. Having a disability, on its own and independently of its causal effects, is neither basically good nor basically bad for disabled people. The second part of the Value-Neutral Model addresses the contributory and instrumental value of disability.[3] Barnes passionately (and justifiably) rejects the idea that disabilities are nearly always bad for us in combination with other things, or that they almost always lead to bad consequences. Even in our flawed, ableism-ridden world, there are plenty of examples of flourishing disabled people whose disabilities have played a pivotal role in their flourishing. She thinks that much of disability's harm in our world is due to ableism in society. If we could achieve an ableism-free society, we could expect to see disabled people fare better. However, Barnes staunchly rejects the view that every bad effect of disability (or impairment) is socially mediated. She offers numerous counterexamples to that idea. Ultimately, Barnes thinks that, as far as contributory and instrumental value go, disability is simply a "mixed bag" and that we should approach disability in much the same way that we approach other "mere-difference" social identities. As she puts it, "[Having a disability] may be good for you, it may be bad for you, it may be utterly indifferent for you -- depending on what it is combined with" (98).

Much of the evidence that Barnes marshals in defense of the Value-Neutral Model consists of testimony of disabled people who claim to value their experience of disability. In Chapter 4, Barnes addresses the widespread suspicion that such testimony is just a matter of "adaptive preferences." Barnes thinks the Sen-Nussbaum model of adaptive preferences is most pertinent to skepticism about disability-positive testimony (129). On this view, a preference is adaptive if it arose due to constraints on one's options and is a preference for something suboptimal (126-28). Barnes offers a three-fold response to the charge that disability-positive testimony is rooted in adaptive preference. First, if this charge applies to disabled people on account of their limited range of options, it would also apply to males in virtue of their inability to get pregnant, give birth, and lactate. So, the strategy overgeneralizes. Second, this accusation depends on thinking that disabled people are in a bad or suboptimal situation, but that is the very issue under debate. Third, writing off disabled people's testimony is an instance of what Miranda Fricker calls "testimonial injustice," which occurs when a speaker is not believed or given due credence because they are a member of a stigmatized group (135).

Chapter 5 tackles an objection that is sometimes raised against mere-difference views of disability: "If disability is a mere difference, then it should be permissible to cause disability, and impermissible to try to 'cure' one's disability. But these implications are intuitively unacceptable. Therefore, disability is not a mere difference." In her careful and systematic discussion, Barnes establishes -- compellingly, in our opinion -- that there is "no direct route from adoption of a mere-difference view of disability to objectionable (im)permissibilities" (166). As she explains, there are countless ways in which a proponent of the mere-difference view might think that a disability should not be caused or is permissible to prevent. Of course, there will be some cases where a mere-difference view allows for causing disability. Barnes contends that one will only find those results objectionable if one is already committed to a bad-difference view. For that reason, this line of objection provides "no independent traction on the question of whether mere-difference views are implausible" (167).

Barnes' Chapter 6 is a rare philosophical treatment of disability pride. Drawing on Fricker's conception of "hermeneutical justice," Barnes argues that disability pride creates epistemic space for disabled people to turn "common sense" bad-difference understandings of disability on their head so that they can begin to make sense of their own experiences and see disability as a neutral or positive trait. In fact, Barnes contends, disability pride makes epistemic room to celebrate disability as a contributing factor to human flourishing against the backdrop of deep-rooted, culturally pervasive assumptions that disability is a bad difference that someone can, at best, thrive "in spite of."

With that brief overview in place, we will now raise three worries about Barnes' discussion.

Systematically biased rules. We suspect that even Barnes' rule-based, social constructionist account of disability does not exclude the possibility of systematically mistaken judgments about what counts as disability. After all, couldn't the rules themselves, and not just their application, be corrupted by prejudice or stigma? Barnes offers no reason to think that these rules might not be grounded in biases, prejudices, or distortions of power relationships that could exist within the disability movement. Nor should we assume that the movement is immune to such problems. Consider, for instance, how Eva Kittay has famously worried that the ideology of the modern disability rights movement, insofar as it relies on the liberal conception of personhood, reciprocal justice, and rational choice, systematically excludes intellectually disabled people from its sphere of moral concern.[4] If "the rules for making judgements about solidarity employed by the disability rights movement" are themselves tainted by bias or power imbalances, there may be physical conditions that are excluded by these rules for reasons that, to borrow Barnes' words, "ought to be orthogonal to whether such conditions are in fact disabilities." The challenge here is to say why the putative problem we're raising for Barnes' rule-based account isn't really a problem or to revise the account in a way that avoids it.

Bad-difference view (ii). In Chapter 2, Barnes provides four examples of bad-difference views, one of which is framed in terms of likelihood:

(ii) Were society fully accepting of disabled people, it would still be the case that for any given disabled person x and any arbitrary non-disabled person y, such that x and y are in relevantly similar personal and socio-economic circumstances, it is likely that x has a lower level of well-being than y in virtue of x's disability. (60)

We believe that (ii) is actually true. First, many disabilities are acquired, and the so-called "transition costs" of moving from a non-disabled state to a disabled state are often substantial. Since these costs are not counterbalanced by the existence of "transition benefits," they will serve to pull down the average well-being level of disabled people. Second, disabilities that are degenerative have something like transition costs built in.[5] Third, some disabilities, such as infantile Tay-Sachs disease, involve great suffering. These facts suggest that, even in ableism-free societies, an arbitrary disabled person is likely to have lower well-being than an arbitrary non-disabled person in virtue of her disability.[6] If (ii) is true, it is tempting to conclude that all mere-difference views, including Barnes' favored model, are false. But we think this is an unsatisfactory response on the grounds that the Value-Neutral Model seems compatible with (ii). The best solution, we propose, is to modify our understanding of bad-difference views to exclude (ii) and any other view that is compatible with Barnes' Value-Neutral Model.

Questions about the defense of the Value-Neutral Model. Barnes' defense of the Value-Neutral Model relies heavily on the fact that many disabled people report valuing their disability experience. Two aspects of this defense raised some questions for us. The first aspect concerns her treatment of disability experience. Throughout much of the book, Barnes seems to be talking about disability. Disability on her social constructionist account seems detachable from the experience of being disabled. Imagine a man who is in an automobile accident that results in him being paralyzed from the waist down and in a temporary coma. Presumably, he qualifies as disabled on Barnes' model (since his physical condition is picked out by the rules governing solidarity judgments of the disability rights movement), though he has not had any experience of being disabled. Yet, in Chapter 3, there is a curious development. In her discussions of running, cancer, and disability, Barnes often moves seamlessly between talking of "X" and "the experience of X" (see, e.g., 82-83, 92-93, 106-7). Even if we grant that the experience of disability can be had only by those who are in fact disabled, a physical disability and one's experience of it are distinct phenomena with different causal profiles. In the context of debating disability's relationship to well-being, it seems important that we are focusing on disability (the condition). After all, many putatively bad things that people associate with disability are neither caused by, nor necessarily incorporated within, one's experience of disability. Our first questions are these: Why does Barnes seem to blur the distinction between disability and disability experience? Are we right to think that disability is detachable from disability experience on her view? And how does testimony about the experience of disability provide support for a view about well-being's relationship with disability itself?

Our other question relates to the discussion of adaptive preferences. Barnes claims that since "whether being disabled is somehow bad or suboptimal is precisely what's up for debate," one cannot simply assume that disabled people have adaptive preferences and use this to critique or dismiss mere-difference views (133, 139). This would beg the question since it requires thinking their situation is suboptimal. That seems exactly right, and we strongly agree with Barnes that disability-positive testimony often is perfectly trustworthy. Even so, we worry that the above reasoning cuts both ways. It might be said: neither can we assume that disabled people have non-adaptive preferences and use this to defend mere-difference views. After all, won't that assumption be rooted in the view that disabled people's situation is not suboptimal? That would also seem to beg the question at issue. For this reason, it might be thought that disability-positive testimony of disabled people is inadmissible as evidence in the debate over bad-, good-, and mere-difference views. Our question: Does this line of objection threaten Barnes' defense of mere-difference views and the Value-Neutral Model, given that it relies heavily (though not exclusively) upon first-person disability-positive testimony?

We suspect that Barnes may have compelling responses to some or all of these concerns, and we should also stress that we find ourselves in wholehearted agreement with most of the claims and arguments in Barnes' book. It is a wildly creative, rigorous, and ground-breaking work that represents a significant contribution to the on-going inquiry into the nature and value of disability. It would not be an exaggeration to claim that it is the most important single-authored book in philosophy of disability to come out of the analytic tradition in a generation.[7]


[1] One important qualification is that Barnes' book only addresses the case of physical disability, as opposed to psychological and cognitive/intellectual disability. In this review, we will adopt Barnes' convention of using "disability" to refer to physical disability.

[2] Stephen M. Campbell and Joseph A. Stramondo, 2017, "The Complicated Relationship of Disability and Well-Being," Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal, forthcoming.

[3] It deserves mention that Barnes develops her own theoretical terminology. For the sake of simplicity and accessibility, we have sought to capture the essence of her view in more familiar terms. We encourage readers to investigate for themselves whether we have been successful.

[4] See, e.g., Eva Kittay, 2001, "The Ethics of Care, Dependence, and Disability," Ratio Juris, 24:1, 51.

[5] We owe this point to David Wasserman.

[6] It might be thought that the "in virtue of" clause screens off the negative effects mentioned above. But many of these costs are psychological or hedonic, and Barnes' introduction of (ii) seems partly motivated by the need to make space for hedonist bad-difference theorists (59).

[7] Thanks to Elizabeth Barnes, Sven Nyholm, and David Wasserman for their feedback on this review.