2016.11.10

Dale Dorsey

The Limits of Moral Authority

Dale Dorsey, The Limits of Moral Authority, Oxford University Press, 2016, 233pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198728900.

Reviewed by Douglas W. Portmore, Arizona State University


Dale Dorsey has written an impressive book, which is a must-read for anyone interested in the normative authority of morality. The book concerns to what extent we should live our lives in accordance with either moral requirements or moral considerations. Suppose, for instance, that I fail to act as the balance of moral considerations supports my acting. Or suppose that I fail to act as I'm morally required to act. Does this mean that I've failed to act as I ought to have acted, all things considered? Not necessarily, argues Dorsey. He argues that we are not always required, all things considered, to act as we are morally required to act. (And, hereafter, I'll use the modifier 'normatively' to indicate when I'm talking about what an agent ought or is required or is permitted to do, all things considered.)

Even if, as Dorsey argues, we are not always normatively required to act as we are morally required to act, are we at least always normatively permitted to act as we're morally required to act? That depends, he argues, on whether we have voluntarily chosen to take on certain projects and commitments. On Dorsey's view, we are all initially normatively permitted to live our lives in accordance with the demands of morality. For we can all voluntarily choose at the beginning of our lives to adopt only those projects and commitments that are compatible with our living accordingly. But once we voluntarily choose to take on other, more partialist, projects and commitments, we cease to have a normative permission to live our lives as morality requires us to live.

That said, Dorsey believes that even those of us who have adopted such partialist projects and commitments are often normatively required to act as we are morally required to act. For he believes that moral considerations constitute genuine normative reasons for action. He's not suggesting, then, that we can just ignore moral considerations and act however the balance of non-moral considerations supports our acting. Indeed, he accepts that we are often normatively required to perform acts that we are morally required to perform. But whereas we are morally required to act impartially with respect to people's interests, we may, given our partialist projects and commitments, be normatively required to act partially towards certain people. And, as a result, we can be normatively required to act contrary to how we are morally required to act. Thus, on Dorsey's picture, morality is really quite limited in its normative authority. For, on his picture, most of us are neither normatively required nor normatively permitted to live as morality requires us to live.

Now, many of us would agree with Dorsey that, in some instances, we are neither normatively required nor normatively permitted to act as it would be morally best for us to act. But Dorsey goes much further and argues that, in many of these same instances, we are neither normatively required nor normatively permitted to act as we are morally required to act. So it's not just that moral considerations have limited normative authority in that they can be outweighed by non-moral considerations, but that moral authority itself (that is, moral requirements) are of limited normative authority in that we can sometimes be normatively required to act contrary to our moral requirements.

The book is, then, bold in its conclusions. And yet Dorsey is able to marshal impressive arguments in favor of them. These arguments are clever, insightful, and challenging. And someone like myself (who disagrees with the conclusions) needs to think hard about how to address them. Not only are the arguments interesting and challenging, but the book itself is a pleasure to read. It is well organized. There is plenty of sign-posting as well as helpful reviews of what has been established and previews of what's to come. It's scholarly, as Dorsey has a great command both of important historical figures and of the contemporary literature. And the book presents a broad and coherent picture of morality and rationality that is better than just the sum of its parts. Yet the parts are of great philosophical interest even to those who are not sympathetic to the big picture. Thus, in defending his picture, Dorsey has independently interesting things to say about several important topics, including rationality, impartiality, supererogation, and the demandingness of morality.

I'll now embark on a brief summary of the book's six chapters, interjecting some of my criticisms along the way. Chapter 1 sets the stage for the rest of the book, explaining important notions, such as that of a normative standpoint (e.g., the moral standpoint), and making clear what the central question "How should I live?" is asking. The question is about how I ought to live, all things considered, as opposed to how I ought morally, prudentially, or aesthetically to live. Of course, some philosophers, such as David Copp, have argued that there is no sensible answer to the question "How should I live, normatively speaking?" but only sensible answers to questions such as "How should I live, morally speaking?" and "How should I live, prudentially speaking?" Against such normative pluralists, Dorsey rightly argues that there is sense to be made of what we normatively ought to do at least if we deny "the independent normativity of the special standpoints (prudence, morality, aesthetics, etc.), and hold that practical rationality is a product of a sui generis normative standpoint" (p. 39). His arguments are intriguing and will need to be taken seriously by normative pluralists.

In Chapter 2, Dorsey argues against what he calls a priori moral rationalism. Whereas moral rationalism claims only that a subject is morally required to φ only if she is normatively required to φ, a priori moral rationalism claims additionally that we can establish this claim independent of any substantive, first-order theorizing about the contents of either moral requirements or normative requirements. He considers three possible ways of trying to do this. The first is to argue that we can establish moral rationalism simply from the fact of morality's obvious importance. But he argues that this won't work because morality could be important in virtue of moral considerations always or typically outweighing non-moral considerations. Thus, morality can be important without moral requirements having the kind of importance that moral rationalism ascribes to them. The second is to argue that moral rationalism is analytic. But he argues that the concept of a moral requirement does not contain the concept of a normative requirement. The third way is to argue for moral rationalism via a conceptual link between blameworthiness and moral requirements. More specifically, some like myself have argued that we can establish a priori moral rationalism via the following two claims: (C1) it is conceptually necessary (indeed, analytic) that a subject is morally required to φ only if she would be blameworthy for freely and knowledgeably failing to φ -- at least, absent suitable excuse -- and (C2) it is a priori that a subject would be blameworthy for freely and knowledgeably failing to φ only if she is normatively required to φ.

Now, Dorsey's response to this argument is to accept C2 but reject C1. For he claims that C1 "seems wrong as a piece of conceptual analysis" (p. 57). But the problem, as I see it, is that Dorsey eschews conceptual analysis of the notion of a moral requirement. And I don't see why we should reject C1 as an incorrect piece of conceptual analysis unless Dorsey can tell us what the concept of a moral requirement is if not, as I think, the sort of requirement to which reactive attitudes such as guilt, indignation, and resentment are appropriate when it is freely and knowledgeably violated without suitable excuse. Does he think that there is no conceptual connection at all between blameworthiness and moral requirements? That seems implausible. To illustrate, imagine that we discover an alien race or culture that labels certain acts as 'inshnoral'. Further imagine that these people deny C2. That is, they deny that being normatively permitted to do something exonerates an agent from being blameworthy for doing that thing. Could it be, then, that 'inshnoral' is correctly translated as 'immoral' even if they don't think that guilt and resentment are appropriate reactions to inshnoral acts that have been freely and knowledgeably performed without suitable excuse? And, if so, how were we able to determine that 'inshnoral' is correctly translated as 'immoral' as opposed to 'ugly', 'rude', 'irrational', or 'imprudent'?

My worry, then, is that it seems impossible to argue against a conceptual link between blameworthiness and moral requirements (that is, against the analyticity of C1) without doing conceptual analysis. Yet Dorsey explicitly avoids doing so, choosing instead to give us only what he takes to be typical markers of a requirement's being moral. And although he admits that one of these markers is that violations of moral requirements are typically blameworthy, he explicitly denies that this marker is a conceptual marker that could be used (even presumptively) to constrain first-order inquiry into the contents of moral requirements (p. 36). But what, then, would constrain first-order inquiry into the contents of moral requirements? Surely, there must be some such constraints if moral requirements are to be conceptually distinct from other sorts of requirements. And if C1 isn't such a constraint, then what is?[1]

In Chapter 3, Dorsey gives the first of two independent arguments against a posteriori moral rationalism -- the view that we can establish moral rationalism via substantive, first-order theorizing about the contents of both moral requirements and normative requirements. In this chapter, he argues that given the impartial nature of the moral point of view and the fact that we have some normative requirements in virtue of our partialist projects and commitments, we are sometimes, contrary to what moral rationalism supposes, morally required to perform acts that we're not normatively required to perform.

His argument relies on what he calls the principle of moral impartiality (PMI). The principle asserts that if the fact that my φ-ing would promote and/or protect the interests of person x constitutes a moral reason for me to φ, then the fact that my ψ-ing would promote and/or protect the equivalent interests of any other person y constitutes a moral reason of equal strength for me to ψ (p. 73). Thus, according to the PMI, if my wife has no greater interest in being rescued by me than some stranger does, the moral reason that I have to promote this stranger's interest in being rescued is just as strong as the moral reason that I have to promote my wife's interest in being rescued. And this holds regardless of my particular projects, relationships, and commitments. So whereas Dorsey concedes that my partialist projects and commitments can make it such that I have more normative reason to rescue my wife than to rescue the stranger, he denies that they can likewise make it such that I have more moral reason to rescue my wife than to rescue the stranger. Why does Dorsey think of the moral point of view in this way despite its obvious counterintuitive moral implications? The answer is that Dorsey finds it intuitive both to think that (C3) "the only thing that can legitimately temper the extent to which a person's interests generate moral reasons in comparison to another is the former's diminished moral importance or status" and that (C4) "no person [excepting 'moral bad guys'] has greater moral status than anyone else" (pp. 72-73).

The problem is that there seems to be no way of consistently understanding C3 and C4 such that they are jointly plausible. C4 is plausible only if we take moral status/importance to be something that doesn't come in degrees -- such as the status of being morally considerable. For if we take moral importance to be something that comes in degrees, then I don't see why we shouldn't think that my lack of any relationship or commitment to a given person can legitimately temper the extent to which that person's interests generate moral reasons for me in comparison to those of another person to whom I have a certain relationship and/or commitment. Moreover, it seems that this can hold even if both persons are equally morally considerable. For instance, it seems that my wife's interests are, relative to me, more morally important than that of some stranger in virtue of the sorts of commitments that I've made to her but have not made to the stranger. And this holds even though the stranger is just as much a morally considerable being as my wife is. So it seems that C4 is plausible only if moral importance is something like being morally considerable, which doesn't come in degrees. Yet C3 is plausible only if we take moral importance to be something that comes in degrees -- that is, as something beyond simply being morally considerable. For if we're talking about tempering the extent to which a person's interests generate moral reasons in proportion to the extent to which their moral importance is lesser than that of another's, then we are assuming that moral importance comes in degrees. Consequently, I don't find C3 and C4 jointly plausible and so don't see any good reason to accept the PMI or reject moral rationalism in light of it.

Of course, Dorsey is well aware that many won't find the PMI as plausible as he does. So, he gives, in Chapter 4, the second of two independent arguments against a posteriori moral rationalism. He argues that accepting the traditional analysis of supererogatory actions -- according to which supererogatory actions are morally optional acts that are morally better than some morally permissible alternative -- commits us to a very implausible first-order account of moral justifiability, where an agent can be morally justified in extorting money from someone so as to promote her own self-interest. It's a clever and sophisticated argument that I don't have space to address here.[2] In any case, the lesson that Dorsey draws from it is that we should accept a revisionary account of supererogatory acts, according to which supererogatory actions are normatively (as opposed to morally) optional acts that are morally better than some normatively (as opposed to morally) permissible alternative. On this revisionary account, some supererogatory acts turn out to be morally required but not normatively required (p. 129). Thus, accepting this revisionary account requires us to deny moral rationalism. And so he thinks that we should deny moral rationalism and accept this revisionary account of supererogation in order to accept that there are supererogatory acts without having to accept the implausible account of moral justification to which the traditional view is supposedly committed.

But if the traditional view is doomed, as Dorsey argues, why not just deny that there are supererogatory acts? The only reason to accept supererogatory acts in the first place is to accommodate our intuitions about there being such acts. But it doesn't seem to me that Dorsey's revisionary account does a very good job of this. Indeed, his revisionary account seems to get things wrong on two fronts. First, it wrongly implies that supererogatory acts cannot be normatively impermissible. But suppose that I give my last two tablets of aspirin to you so as to alleviate your mild headache rather than take them myself and alleviate my migraine. Intuitively, it seems that my act is supererogatory but not normatively permissible. Second, Dorsey's view implies that a supererogatory act cannot be normatively required. But suppose that I have already read several drafts of a student's paper and so have no moral duty to read yet another draft. But if my reading one more draft is likely make the difference to her keeping her scholarship, then it seems to be the thing that I'm normatively required to do even though it is supererogatory.[3] So, as these examples illustrate, Dorsey's account of supererogation doesn't seem to do a very good job capturing our intuitions about which acts are supererogatory. So it's unclear why we should accept it and thus unclear why we should reject moral rationalism so as to accept it.

In Chapters 5 and 6, Dorsey concludes the book by arguing for a default normative permission to live in accordance with moral demands. He argues that we all start off with a normative permission to live as morality requires us to live, but argues that as some of us take on partialist projects and commitments we thereby enhance the normative weight of certain considerations beyond their weight from the moral point of view, and, consequently, we cease having a normative permission to live as morality requires us to live. Thus, Dorsey argues that we possess a capacity to strengthen practical reasons through our voluntary choices and thereby place ourselves under the authority of particular reasons or even entire standpoints to a greater extent than they would have absent these voluntary choices. We can, for instance, voluntarily form commitments to others and make the promotion of their interests one of our projects and thereby strengthen the normative reasons we have for protecting and/or promoting their interests. Yet we cannot strengthen the moral reasons we have for doing so, and this explains why we can be normatively required to act contrary to what we are morally required to do.

As I hope this review makes clear, this is a fascinating and important book that I encourage others to read and engage with critically, as I have attempted to do here.[4]


[1] Note that Dorsey has challenged the idea that we can distinguish moral requirements from other sorts of requirements prior to substantive, first-order inquiry into the moral domain. See his "Moral Distinctiveness and Moral Inquiry," Ethics 126 (2016): 747-773.

[2] The argument is addressed both in Alfred Archer's "Moral Obligation, Self-Interest and the Transitivity Problem" and my "Transitivity, Moral Latitude, and Supererogation," both of which are forthcoming in Utilitas.

[3] For more on how certain supererogatory acts are normatively impermissible and others are normatively required, see Elizabeth Harman's "Morally Permissible Moral Mistakes," Ethics 126 (2016): 366-393.

[4] I thank Dale Dorsey and Liz Harman for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.