2016.12.10

A. John Simmons

Boundaries of Authority

A. John Simmons, Boundaries of Authority, Oxford University Press, 2016, 263pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190603489.

Reviewed by Anna Stilz, Princeton University


Well-known for his critique of political obligation and for his work on John Locke, A. John Simmons has in recent years written critically -- and illuminatingly -- on Rawlsian and Kantian political philosophy. His new book argues that this tradition lacks the resources to theorize the boundaries of the sovereign state: it cannot offer a plausible account of how a state might legitimately assert rule over a particular population and territory, and control its natural resources and borders. Simmons presents a Lockean voluntarist theory he claims can do better when compared not only to Kantian/Rawlsian approaches, but also to nationalist and "plebiscitary" competitors. (It is worth noting that since there are two chapters addressing distinct issues of practical authority and civil disobedience, the book is loosely unified around the boundary theme).

Many have noted Rawls's neglect of boundary questions, reflected in the opening pages of Theory of Justice, which suggest that the society for which Rawls's theory is designed is a "closed system isolated from other societies."[1] Rawls sets aside all questions about how that society's membership and territorial boundaries are constituted. Instead, he simply focuses on reforming the state's domestic institutional structure, as it now is, in the direction of an ideal of egalitarian justice.

I think Simmons is correct to diagnose this neglect of "boundary questions" as a fundamental problem for Rawlsian political theory. It has generated a familiar cosmopolitan critique of the idea that the boundaries of sovereign states might limit principles of justice. The cosmopolitan argues that Rawls's principles for the domestic basic structure ought to be extended to the world at large. A rather different response, favored by Simmons and myself, holds that while Rawls was wrong in failing to offer a justification for the sovereign state's boundaries, that does not mean no such account can be given. And, contra the cosmopolitan, it seems that such an account is necessary. For, as Simmons rightly points out, the justice of a state's institutions is insufficient to establish its right to rule. Even a perfectly just state may not impose itself on a territory and its population against their will. Suppose, to use Simmons's example, that the US were to move its southern border several miles south into Mexico, and to effectively and fairly administer justice in this new territory, extending US citizenship to the former Mexicans (75). Most of us think that these Mexicans would have an important complaint about the unilateral imposition of US rule, a complaint that is not answered by incorporating them into the US citizenry on equal terms, or providing them just governance. This suggests the need for some theory of "boundary legitimacy." Such a theory would show which people and what territory should be included in the state in the first place, and it should provide a convincing response to the cosmopolitan, by demonstrating that it would be morally wrong to ignore boundary questions in simply extending domestic standards of justice to the globe. Before we theorize how a state should rule, in other words, we must explain why it has any right to rule, and in particular, why it has a right to rule these particular people and this particular space.

In order to articulate the needed account of "boundary legitimacy," Simmons argues we must turn away from the dominant strain in contemporary political philosophy, which he calls "Kantian functionalism." Simmons believes that a successful account of boundaries must be historical in nature: that is, it must focus on the actual history of how persons and territories came to be subjected to a particular state's rule. Because Kantian theories are purely presentist or forward-looking, they cannot make principled room for these historical considerations. As Simmons puts it, Kantians focus on structural injustice at the expense of historical illegitimacy (50). Paradigmatic examples of historical illegitimacy, for Simmons, are the conquest and relocation of indigenous peoples and the forcible incorporation of unwilling minorities. Such past wrongs ought not to be ignored: instead, if the state's territorial and membership boundaries are to be fully legitimate, according to Simmons, they must be rectified.

So Simmons instead looks to Lockean voluntarism for his theory of boundary legitimacy. On this view, the state's territorial and membership boundaries are constructed on the basis of free choices of individuals "to submit both themselves and the land on which they live and work to the state's authority" (117). The state's membership boundaries legitimately extend only to its consenting citizens, and its territorial boundaries encompass only the prepolitical property holdings of these citizens. This view gives rightful territorial boundaries a strongly historical quality: to be legitimate, boundaries must be traced back to initially just acquisitions on the part of state founders. Simmons argues that when compared to its competitors, his Lockean theory can better account for our concerns about historical dispossession and the unwilling subjection of minorities. Unlike Kantian, nationalist, and hybrid views, the Lockean resists any "supersession" of rights in land. And since Lockean voluntarism holds that legitimate political authority depends on the actual consent of its subjects, trapped minorities cannot be subjected to political rule against their will (123).

Simmons further argues that this Lockean voluntarism provides only limited support to states' more "property-like" claims to exclude others from entering territory or using natural resources. The Lockean theory supports excluding outsiders from the state's airspace or territorial waters only to the extent this is necessary to perform states' morally mandatory functions, such as providing national defense. It underwrites citizens' claims to control resources that are essential to their projects and legitimate ways of life, but only so long as they leave "enough and as good for others." The Lockean view cannot support claims to resources valued solely for their wealth-creating properties (e.g, oil and subsurface minerals), or resources that are unused (208-). Finally, a Lockean theory supports a state's right to exclude outsiders from its territory only so long as members have historical property rights over the area, and so long as they take no more than their fair share of land (240-1).

Simmons's important book diagnoses a fundamental "boundary" problem for contemporary political theory, and there is much to learn about territorial questions from its pages. As the best developed Lockean account of boundaries, it is essential reading for anyone interested in these matters. Yet I am unconvinced both by Simmons' critique of the Kantian tradition and by his Lockean voluntarist alternative. I believe the Kantian tradition can do better at explaining the legitimacy of boundaries than Simmons recognizes. And I also think that Simmons's own view has counterintuitive implications, and is underdeveloped on key issues.

Let me sketch what I see as a plausible response to Simmons's critique of "Kantian functionalism." Simmons complains that this view is committed to allowing the unilateral imposition of just institutions on unwilling subjects, a position that denies "that individual liberty has any moral value worth considering" (82). But it is wrong to think that the Kantian tradition is necessarily committed to imposing institutions, or that it pays no regard to individual freedom. The single innate right of humanity, according to Kant, is the right to freedom-as-independence: the right to make one's own decisions free from subjection to others. Where Kant departs from Locke is in holding that we cannot fulfill our duty to respect this innate right unless we submit to some legitimate state. Since our rightful independence is bounded by an enforceable duty to respect others' equivalent claims, Kant holds that we can be coerced to submit to political rule where our submission is essential to upholding the freedom of others.

But this suggests a plausible Kantian answer to Simmons's worries. The political incorporation of unwilling people into the state can be justified, on Kantian grounds, only where it is essential to securing others' freedom. Where the submission of the unwilling is not essential to the provision of justice, they cannot be coercively subjected. That is because Kant's innate right to independence gives those individuals a right to make decisions about their own lives, including decisions about which political unit they wish to belong to, so long as these decisions are compatible with securing others' rightful freedoms. So the Kantian view authorizes the coercive imposition of a political order only in a narrow range of cases. Simmons's example of the colonial incorporation of Mexico, in my view, falls outside this range. Securing US citizens' rightful freedoms in no way requires or depends upon subjecting unwilling Mexicans. So the Kantian argument offers no justification for incorporating the Mexicans in this case.

Consider two other examples where the Kantian would support imposing political institutions on the unwilling: anarchists who refuse to recognize any duty to submit to a state, and dispersed ideological minorities, like socialists, who are not capable of territorial organization in representative institutions. A Kantian would suggest that -- to the extent he has sustained interactions with others -- the anarchist's freedom can justifiably be limited, because allowing him to live in a stateless scenario is not compatible with protecting others' rights (which require institutional specification, interpretation, and enforcement). In the case of the socialist, the Kantian would hold that so long as there no feasible configuration of political authority that could secure justice for others and accommodate her socialist values, her freedom too must be limited. In my view, these are plausible justifications for incorporating unwilling persons into the state. Both of them appeal to the fact that our claims to freedom are necessarily limited: they are bounded by a general duty to secure the institutional protection of others' rights. But this general duty does not require everyone to be subject to the same political institutions: so long as a separate political unit for unwilling minorities would be (a) minimally just and (b) can be feasibly and stably instituted, we should allow them to create it.

I stress this response because I find unconvincing Simmons's claim that Lockean voluntarism does better than Kantianism at accounting for our intuitions about colonized minorities. The Lockean suggests that individual anarchists -- and indeed, most ordinary citizens -- share the very same complaint as colonized groups, since as Simmons puts it, "all are illegitimately subjected to state coercion" (53) without consent. Yet, intuitively, it seems to me that the British Empire's Indian subjects had a different (and more compelling) complaint about political subjection than did a non-consenting inhabitant of Liverpool. Since the Kantian can explain why the Indians had standing to reject the British Empire -- because they were greatly alienated from their government, and political independence for them would not jeopardize the rightful freedoms of the British -- it can accommodate their claim to decolonization.

I also doubt Simmons's contention that if it is to be fully legitimate, an ideal global order must rectify all historic wrongs. One of the most distinctive features of Simmons's book is his critique, in Chapter 7, of the supersession of historical property rights. He suggests that these rights persist indefinitely through time and continue to demand rectification, though they are sometimes overridden by competing considerations, and can be affected by changing circumstances. Simmons holds that individuals can acquire natural rights over previously unowned land by usefully employing it in their projects and purposive activities (163). He further argues that these rights to land are heritable and "descend down family lines" (174). Finally, he suggests that the original owner's (or his heirs') right to an unjustly taken thing can "remain through any number of unjust transfers of the thing over any period of time" (164).

Yet, to me, this view has intuitively implausible consequences. Take the ancient kingdom of Mercia, conquered and settled by Vikings in the 8th century. I will assume (perhaps wrongly) that the Mercians were rightful Lockean owners of their territory. On Simmons's principles, then, the first generation of Mercian victims had a right against the first generation of Viking wrongdoers to restore their land and kingdom. Moreover, since the passage of time involves no supersession of rights, some vestige of this right must persist today. Of course, since descendants of Vikings and Mercians have long since intermarried, and now inhabit other parts of the world, it is very difficult to untangle these issues. But suppose that an amateur genealogist proves that the blood running in his veins is largely of Mercian extraction. On Simmons's principles, it seems he has a right to see his ancestral Mercian lands restored. Of course, since population in Central Britain has increased greatly since the 8th century, these rights will have to be downsized, and since others now have expectations of living there, his right may be overridden by their interests. But some moral residue of the right persists, requiring perhaps that he receive (at least a symbolic) share of former Mercian lands, or an apology.

But -- one wants to say! -- no such descendant has any interest in restoring the Mercian kingdom, or in returning to live where it once existed. These descendants are doing just fine where they now are, with lives that differ greatly from their Mercian ancestors. Moreover, this view relies on a number of controversial assumptions -- about the shape and scope of natural property rights, and the permissibility of inheritance -- that have often been questioned. Given this, why think that ideal justice requires the rectification of all past territorial wrongs? Here Simmons's view requires additional defense and development, or so it seems to me.

Finally, many of the implications of Simmons's account importantly turn on how to interpret the Lockean "fair share proviso": what exactly does it mean to leave "enough and as good" territory for others? For the most part, Simmons doesn't engage this question. He briefly discusses an "island castaway" case (181-2), which suggests that each person might be owed access to a 1/n-sized amount of the earth's surface, where n refers to the total number of the globe's inhabitants.

But does this proposal have any intuitive appeal? Consider two individuals, a member of a nomadic hill tribe in Burma, and a resident of modern-day Tokyo. The hill tribesman disposes of more space than the Tokyo-dweller does, and depends on that larger space to sustain his way of life. On the "equal shares" view, it seems the nomads must "downsize" their territory, or allow the Tokyo-dwellers to migrate into it. Imagine informing the Tokyo inhabitant, however, of her new right to move to mountainous Burma in order to claim her fair share of the earth. It seems unlikely that she would care: after all, nothing about her projects depends on accessing such a large quantity of space. She can live a flourishing and satisfactory life where she now is, in Tokyo. Here too, it strikes me that the Lockean view requires further development to be convincing.


[1] Rawls, A Theory of Justice, (Harvard University Press, 1971), 8.