Jeong Yak-yong (Dasan)

The Analects of Dasan, Volume 1: A Korean Syncretic Reading

Jeong Yak-yong (Dasan), The Analects of Dasan, Volume 1: A Korean Syncretic Reading, Hongkyung Kim (tr. and comm.), Oxford University Press, 2016, 260pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190624996.

Reviewed by Richard Kim, Saint Louis University

Even among contemporary Western philosophers with an interest in East Asian philosophy, there are relatively few who are familiar with the works of Jeong Yak-yong (Dasan, 1762-1836), arguably the most brilliant mind in Korean intellectual history. The neglect of Dasan is in part due to the lack of English translations of his works. Hongkyung Kim's translation and commentary is an important step toward introducing the writings of one of the most outstanding thinkers in Korean history.

This book is the first of a six-volume set that will offer a complete English translation of Dasan's commentary on the Analects. This first volume covers Dasan's commentaries on Analects 1.1 through Analects 3.26. For each chapter there is an English translation of the passage, followed by Dasan's commentary, which is then followed by Kim's own comments. Together with Kim's commentary, the book runs 260 pages (including index), revealing not only Dasan's breadth of knowledge ranging over two millennia worth of commentaries on the Analects, but also Kim's own deep knowledge of the history of Confucianism and Korean intellectual history.

Kim begins with an excellent scholarly introduction that helps readers unfamiliar with Dasan understand his importance in Korean intellectual history, situating him in the cultural and intellectual context of his time and identifying his contributions to the Korean philosophical tradition. Kim's brief sketch of Dasan's life demonstrates his prolific scholarly output, as well as some of the challenges he faced during his life: losing his mother at the tender age of seven and an 18 year exile for his family connections to Catholicism during a wave of persecution of Catholics in Korea that resulted in the execution of his third older brother. Following the biographical sketch, Kim offers a historical explanation of how Dasan achieved his current status as one of the most revered intellectual heroes of Korea, and also a clear account of where Dasan scholarship in Korea stands today.

One of Kim's primary tasks is to, "show how Dasan's works attempted to synthesize all past Confucian commentaries and the philosophical ideas contained therein." (10) What Kim's introduction -- and the commentary of Dasan itself -- reveals, is a creative and independent mind that was willing to critically engage with the ideas of canonical figures (e.g. Zhu Xi), at times even (respectfully) dissenting from them, while also drawing widely on the scholarship of past and contemporary thinkers from Korea, China, and Japan. In this way, Dasan captures the kind of philosophical spirit that contemporary philosophers prize: the willingness to carefully assess the ideas and arguments of others, independent of their stature, and go where the arguments lead. This is not to say that Dasan was an intellectual rebel, aiming to bring down authority and tradition. In fact, it is clear that he is self-consciously seeking to build on the past achievements of scholars, working within an inherited philosophical framework, and adopting whatever resources he could find to advance the Confucian tradition. This attitude of both working within one's own tradition and at the same time aiming to advance it through critical engagement with the ideas and arguments of those outside of that tradition is also exemplified by another brilliant synthesizer, Thomas Aquinas, who was willing to borrow from the ideas of both pagan thinkers and Islamic philosophers to extend the Catholic philosophical tradition that he was firmly committed to.

The synthesis that Dasan endeavored to create was between, on the one hand, the deeply practical orientation of the classical Confucian texts represented in the movement of 'Practical Learning' and, on the other hand, the neo-Confucianism grounded in the thoughts of Zhu Xi -- what scholars sometimes refer to as "Cheng-Zhu neo-Confucianism", which stood firmly as the orthodox view during the Joseon era. Following some of the critical voices of both the Evidential Studies in Qing China and the Ancient Learning in Tokugawa Japan, Dasan also objected to Cheng-Zhu neo-Confucianism's focus on what he believed to be excessively metaphysical discourse, and sought to establish his own moral philosophy in a more realistic moral psychology. Nevertheless, as Kim points out, Dasan is more aptly understood as not seeking to overturn the neo-Confucian tradition, but as aiming to revise it and integrate it with what he understood as the authentic teachings revealed in classical Confucian texts. As already noted, he aimed to achieve this by drawing widely on both old and new commentaries from Korea, China, and Japan, frequently challenging the dominant views of key passages, even when they are endorsed by revered figures like Zhu Xi. These discussions reveal a character marked by intellectual courage and unwillingness to compromise his views even in the face of powerful social pressures.

Even seasoned readers of the Analects will find novel insights in this book. Take for example Dasan's interpretation of Analects 2.11, which is translated as "The Master said, 'He renews what he has learned and acquires new knowledge; it is worth being a teacher.'" As Kim points out, every English translation assumes that this passage is about the characteristics that are necessary for being a teacher. Dasan, however, takes it to refer to those activities that reveal the value of being a teacher, thereby refocusing the passage on why being a teacher is choiceworthy.

Kim's own commentary helps clarify Dasan's ideas, drawing attention to what exactly he was aiming to accomplish, and showing why Dasan offers a significant contribution to the understanding of the Analects. As someone who is not steeped in the commentarial tradition of the Analects, I often found Kim's discussions helpful, especially when offering the 'big picture' behind Dasan's, at times, painstakingly careful discussions of historical documents. For example, Dasan's lengthy commentary on Analects 3.16 (on ritual archery), which goes into minute details, might appear to be just another technical discussion of a Confucian practice. Kim, however, argues that on closer examination, Dasan is rejecting certain interpretations on rational or conceptual grounds, and then using classical texts to support his view. This point, which might have easily escaped the notice of the reader, demonstrates that while Dasan is strongly committed to the truth of the classical texts, they are not the only source of understanding for him.

If I had one suggestion about how this book could have been strengthened, it would be that Kim's commentaries could have made a greater attempt to show how Dasan's discussions are relevant to issues in contemporary philosophy. For contemporary Western philosophers with an interest in Confucianism because of its potential for engagement with contemporary philosophical issues, this book will most likely be too entrenched within the Confucian tradition to be helpful. This is not to say that Dasan's (or Kim's) commentaries do not have anything valuable to contribute to contemporary Western philosophical issues. A number of recent works by contemporary Western philosophers use classical Confucian texts to illuminate questions in contemporary philosophy.[1] Of course, not everything can be done in a single book. But in future volumes if Kim could incorporate discussions of how Dasan's ideas can engage with, for example, issues in contemporary moral philosophy, I think it would greatly enrich this project.

As noted above, this is only the first of a six volume series that translates Dasan's commentary on the Analects into English. Given the outstanding quality of both the translation and commentary, all scholars with an interest in deepening their understanding of the Analects, Confucianism, and East Asian philosophy more generally should eagerly anticipate the completion of this project. I highly recommend this book to anybody interested in these topics.


My thanks to Youngsun Back and Xueying Wang for comments on a draft of this review.

[1] See for example Hagop Sarkissian's (2010) "The Problems and Promise of Situationism in Moral Philosophy," Philosophers' Imprint, 10:9, pp. 1-15; Edward Slingerland's (2011) "The Situationist Critique and Early Confucian Virtue Ethics," Ethics, 121:2, pp. 390-419; and Owen Flanagan's (2014) Moral Sprouts and Natural Teleologies: 21st Century Moral Psychology Meets Classical Chinese Philosophy, Marquette University Press.