2017.02.20

Joshua W. Seachris and Stewart Goetz (eds.)

God and Meaning: New Essays

Joshua W. Seachris and Stewart Goetz (eds.), God and Meaning: New Essays, Bloomsbury, 2016, 265pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781628927634.

Reviewed by Katherine Dormandy, University of Innsbruck


Meeting a non-philosopher can elicit the question, "So what is the meaning of life?" On the spot I might until recently have found myself thinking (if not answering) something like, "That's what I studied philosophy to figure out, but actually we don't discuss it much". Why not? "It's too complex", "The question is too ambiguous", "Meaning is too closely tied to an externally defined purpose, which you won't believe life has unless you're a supernaturalist". But I am now glad to report that there is a growing literature on the meaning of life, and even gladder that anti-supernaturalist presuppositions (helpfully discussed in Joshua W. Seachris and Stewart Goetz's introduction) do not constrain the contributors to God and Meaning. This is a timely book whose contributors expound, in interesting and creative ways, theistic approaches to perhaps the most important, yet strangely neglected, philosophical question.

I'll discuss each contribution and finish with some general remarks.

In "The Meaning of Life and Scripture's Redemptive-Historical Narrative", Seachris argues that the meaning of life is best understood as "a narrative . . . across those features of life of greatest existential import" (15). He argues that, in order for such a narrative to qualify as the meaning of life, it must (i) answer existential questions and (ii) be true. He applies this account to his own, Christian, religious tradition. Seachris's approach is fascinating but sparse. Crucial notions are left unclear, not least "narrative" (must narratives have a specific structure? closure? what is it for a non-literal narrative to be true?). Moreover, one wonders why Seachris takes the notion of narrative to serve his purposes better than that of explanation. His discussion of Christian scripture has great promise but also lacks detail. For example, although he calls suffering an important existential question, his discussion does not reveal how scripture answers it -- leaving us to wonder whether Seachris's own tradition succeeds as a meaning-of-life narrative by his own criteria.

In "What God Could (and Couldn't) Do to Make Life Meaningful", Tim Mawson argues that there is a sense of meaning, propounded by Sartre, on which God's existence does not contribute to life's meaning, but detracts from it. On this sort of meaning, which Mawson argues (by appeal to colorful thought experiments) is valuable, your life is meaningful to the extent that you yourself determine its course. Mawson then argues that, on another sense of meaning, that of contributing to an overarching scheme of things, God's existence does make life meaningful. The problem is that the more you have of one type of meaning, the less you have of the other. The theist might deny that this need be so by claiming that, since you don't have a choice anyway, you might willingly resign yourself to God's purpose and so count both as having chosen it and as fitting into a larger scheme of things. But you would still lack Sartrean meaning, for God, not you, would still be the originator of this purpose. There is another answer is open to the theist that Mawson does not discuss: you might appropriate God's purpose, not because it is inevitable but because you see it to be good. This is still not Sartrean meaning (because the originator of the purpose is still God), but this option might make the forfeit of Sartrean meaning seem less important.

Goetz, in "Hedonistic Happiness and Life's Meaning", defends a theistic hedonist account, on which "God creates human persons for the purpose that they experience nothing but pleasure" (64), where pleasure is the same as happiness. Goetz defends the theistic aspect of this view, responding to Bernard Williams's (1973) argument that eternal life cannot be pleasurable because it will be intolerably tedious. He also defends hedonism, most saliently against Nozick's experience-machine thought experiment. Nozick, he says, establishes that many of us desire imperfect reality over perfect machine-generated pleasure; but Goetz denies that our desires are "thoroughly reliable" evidence (69) that reality will bring greater happiness (for desires can be misleading), so they do not indicate that happiness is anything more than pleasure. But Goetz's demand for "thoroughly reliable" evidence is too exacting, since only Cartesian evidence (and perhaps not even that) is "thoroughly reliable". Goetz then endeavors to explain the alleged misleadingness of our desires in the case of the experience machine. He suggests that we confuse what will make us happy (namely, pleasurable experiences) with the source of our pleasurable experiences thus far (i.e., reality). I find this explanation puzzling. It is not clear why we would associate reality as such with pleasure, since reality also delivers unpleasant experiences.

Trent Dougherty argues that "Belief That Life Has Meaning Confirms That Life Has Meaning" -- or more specifically: the fact that many people believe that life has meaning is evidence supporting theism over naturalism. Dougherty holds the prior probabilities of these competing hypotheses fixed, and argues that theism predicts widespread belief in meaning more strongly than naturalism does -- indeed, by a stunning factor of 6000 (89). Dougherty also discredits alternative, evolutionary, explanations for belief in widespread meaning. One worry is that the discrepancy between the predictive power of theism and that of naturalism may not be as wide as Dougherty argues, at least when we add the following piece of background knowledge: although most of our beliefs are reliable, beliefs about our own future prospects tend to be unreliable. "Positive illusions" are widely documented and, psychologists suggest, "motivate us to get out of bed and optimistically take up challenges we might shrink from" (Chabris and Simons 2009, 126). Naturalism, conjoined with this background information, is a better predictor of belief in widespread meaning than otherwise (and no evolutionary arguments need feature). Moreover, this background information does not seem a natural bedfellow for theism, for unreliable beliefs are a bad thing whereas theism, Dougherty says, predicts mainly good things (86). Hence naturalism may be a stronger competitor to theism, at least vis-à-vis widespread belief in meaning, than Dougherty concludes.

In "Can the Demands of the Perfection Thesis Be Trivialized?", Nicholas Waghorn considers the perfection thesis: in order to find ultimate meaning, you must achieve an end of "maximally conceivable value" (99). The perfect happiness of theistic heaven, which Waghorn construes as perfect desire-fulfillment, is a natural contender for being this end. Waghorn considers an objection to the perfection thesis, and thus to the relevance of heaven (so construed): that this thesis can be "trivialized" by desiring the state you are in rather than an ideal state. But Waghorn argues that this way of achieving perfect happiness does not deliver: you would have to desire anything that might befall you, which would empty the desire of any real content. Waghorn's argument is intriguing (if at times mind-bending). But one might wonder whether perfect desire-fulfillment is really as congenial to theistic meaning as Waghorn seems to think. Surely theistic meaning involves mind-independent components that we won't desire until we are fully sanctified. Indeed, there seems an easier way to argue that the perfection thesis cannot be trivialized: one might observe that what will make our sanctified selves perfectly happy in heaven differs from what we tend to desire on earth, so achieving theistic meaning requires us to strive for a distant ideal.

In "Meaningfulness, Eternity, and Theism", John Cottingham asks, first, whether God's existence would make life meaningful at all. One might doubt it, since (by analogy with the Euthyphro dilemma) either life is meaningful simply because God gives it meaning, in which case meaning is arbitrarily determined by God; or life has meaning independently, in which case God seems superfluous. Cottingham moves between the horns, arguing that life is meaningful not because God determines meaning but because what God determines is -- due to his nature -- always meaningful. Second, Cottingham asks how God's existence makes life meaningful. A natural answer appeals to our eternal life,but Cottingham accepts Williams's argument (1973) that eternal life would yield intolerable tedium. Rather, he argues that meaning comes from God's being eternal: this enables human actions to be "eternally stored and cherished in the loving presence of God" (132), who rejoices in them (or at least in the good ones). But Cottingham's agreement with Williams yields unresolved tension. Since Cottingham holds that we do live eternally, he must explain how, given the supposed tedium of eternity, God could rejoice in (and thus give positive meaning to) our post-mortem actions.

Charles Taliaferro's "The Expansion and Contraction of the Meaning of Life" considers two opposing views. Optimistic naturalism says that there is no transcendent reality, but that immanent life has the necessary ingredients for meaning (love, smiles, etc.). Platonic theism says that God exists and that immanent life thus has greater meaning than otherwise. Taliaferro argues that optimistic naturalists are committed to hoping that their view is false and platonic theism true: if you love someone, surely you want her to be happy eternally rather than to die. It is unlikely that optimistic naturalists would disagree that platonic theism is worth hoping for -- as long as eternal life is blissful. But why suppose it would be blissful? Taliaferro does not say. If Williams is right that eternity would bring intolerable tedium, or if the Christian belief in hell (including for some we love) is true, then the hope for platonic theism is not even clearly rational, let alone a commitment of optimistic naturalism.

Richard Swinburne gives an account of "How God Makes Life a Lot More Meaningful". He claims that what makes life worthwhile includes enjoyment, having the power to affect the world in important ways, having true beliefs and correct feelings, and having relationships centered around common projects. He then argues that the existence of the Christian God would multiply and deepen these goods. God's existence would generate new pleasures, promote understanding of ultimate reality, enable correct feelings toward an awesome transcendent being, enable us to pursue common projects with such a being, and generate higher moral standards to strive for. God's existence would also enable the great good of eternal life in heaven. Swinburne's arguments are germane to those who value the sort of meaning, discussed by Mawson, that comes from belonging to a larger scheme of things. But they may be less well received by those who value Mawson's Sartrean meaning, which comes from autonomously choosing one's own purpose.

Paul Moser defends the "Affective Gethsemane Meaning for Life" account, on which the meaning of life amounts to discovering and obeying God's will. Moser's view hinges on the notion of an affective experience of God's will. Such experience, he argues, is necessary for discovering God's will and being motivated to obey it. Moser's account is promising and rich, sometimes at the expense of clarity. For example, the notion of "God's purpose" or "God's will" is hard to parse. On one reading, it is not clear why religious experience should be needed to discover it -- can't we discover it simply by hearing a sermon that God wants us to love our neighbor? Alternatively, Moser sometimes seems to understand God's will in more micro-managerial terms, as in "You must give to charity x instead of charity y". But it is unclear how religious experience can be expected to reveal God's will in this sense, especially without any discussion of how to distinguish religious experience from our own inclinations. The believer who seeks "affective Gethsemane" meaning in life would wish for detail on these matters.

In "St. Isaac's Dictum", Terence Cuneo explores how the saying of the Eastern Orthodox saint, "This life has been given to you for repentance", illuminates the meaning of life. Repentance, argues Cuneo, is "an emotionally engaged recognition" that one falls short of Christian moral perfection, and it requires "lowering oneself in . . . a way that acknowledges and emphasizes one's own lack of excellence or accomplishments" (195, emphasis added). Repentance is key to the Orthodox meaning of life, he argues, because it is "paradoxically . . . what enables us to more closely approximate" Christian perfection (193). Yet this perspective on the meaning of life, though fascinating, has a problem that Cuneo leaves unaddressed. Repentance as Cuneo describes it (and portrays it in his interesting discussion of Eastern Orthodox liturgy) seems to involve an extreme a focus on the self (see my emphasis above). Yet seeking Christian perfection would seem to involve focusing instead on God. Acknowledging one's failures is of course crucial to the Christian life, but self-focus that risks eclipsing God has surely gone too far.

Tremper Longman III's chapter on Ecclesiastes, "'Meaningless, Meaningless, Says Qohelet': Finding the Meaning of Life in the Book of Ecclesiastes", helpfully clarifies the significance of cultural references and historical context. Craig Bartholomew's (more philosophical) chapter, "Wisdom and Meaning: Philosophy and Theology of the Meaning of Life in Ecclesiastes" characterizes the empirical epistemology with which Qohelet tries to discover the meaning of life, distinguishing it from the revelation-centric epistemology that the book ultimately advocates. The two chapters largely agree on the book's message about the meaning of life, namely that it is found in God (though they differ over whether Qohelet has himself discovered this). The contributions disagree, however, about whether meaning can also be found in the earthly pleasures -- wisdom, love, labor -- in which Qohelet seeks it. Longman argues that meaning is not found in these pleasures, whereas Bartholomew argues that they do confer meaning when appreciated in the light of God. This is an interesting enough difference between the chapters to make both worth including in an anthology of Protestant interpretations of Ecclesiastes, but perhaps not to include both under a title as general as God and Meaning.

This brings me to one worry about the book as a whole: it might have more appropriately been called The Christian God and Meaning. Although half of the authors develop general monotheistic views, all are Christians and the remaining half endorse explicitly Christian pictures. Even Ecclesiastes -- part of the Jewish scriptures -- is interpreted (by both essays on it) in light of the New Testament. Do not get me wrong -- discussion among Christian theists is of great value. My complaint merely concerns the false advertising. The book's title perpetuates the view, untenable in our age of interreligious encounter, that a book with a heavy focus on the Christian God can speak for theism more generally. This sense of one-dimensionality is enhanced by Bartholomew's unhelpfully naming "Islamic terrorism" as one of the world's evils (228), when he could easily have chosen a word that does not pigeonhole an entire world religion.

The volume is similarly homogenous along the gender dimension, without a single woman in a lineup of twelve authors. I am by no means impugning the excellence of the individual contributors. I am merely observing that there are surely equally excellent female philosophers with worthy thoughts about the important topic of God and the meaning of life. Especially given increasing discussion in the philosophical community about the underrepresentation of women (see e.g. Hutschinson and Jenkins 2013), it is unfortunate that none appear here.

Aside from these limitations to the volume as a whole, each contribution is well worth a read.

REFERENCES

Chabris, Christopher; Daniel Simons (2009). The Invisible Gorilla and Other Ways Our Intuitions Deceive Us, Crown.

Hutchinson, Katrina; Fiona Jenkins (2013). Women in Philosophy: What Needs to Change? Oxford University Press.

Williams, Bernard (1973). "The Makropulos Case: Reflections on the Tedium of Immortality", Problems of the Self, Cambridge University Press, 82-100.