2017.03.16

Max Cresswell

Logical Modalities from Aristotle to Carnap: The Story of Necessity

Max Cresswell, Edwin Mares, Adriane Rini (eds.), Logical Modalities from Aristotle to Carnap: The Story of Necessity, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 348pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107077881.

Reviewed by Simo Knuuttila, University of Helsinki


In their introduction, the editors say that some years ago, when they were reflecting on modality, possible worlds, and related matters, they started asking where philosophers through the ages have thought that necessity originates and what have they said necessity is. This is the background of this book, which is particularly meant to shed light on how understanding the nature of necessity requires a consideration of its role in logic. Nevertheless, the work is not strictly limited to this theme, and while all papers address modality, not all are about what readers might regard as logical necessity. Some more elaboration of this issue, also hinted at in the title, would have been welcome in the introduction, where the first question is about the origin of necessity -- is it in logic, metaphysics, or natural philosophy? On the other side, much elucidation is given to these issues in fifteen learned papers, each of some 20 pages: four on ancient philosophy (three on Aristotle and one on the Stoics), three on medieval philosophy (Avicenna, Abelard and his predecessors, and Ockham and late medieval thought), four on early modern philosophy (two papers on Leibniz, one on Cudworth, Boyle, and Lowde, and one on Locke and others), and four on more recent thinkers (Kant, Peirce, C.I. Lewis, Carnap).

The authors on Aristotle are well-known experts on his modal syllogistic. In the opening chapter, Adriane Rini aims to explicate how Aristotle himself understood the necessity involved in his famous definition of syllogism (deduction) in the Prior Analytics. She thinks that a somewhat neglected source for answering this question is provided by Aristotle's systematic attempt to show through counter-examples that non-syllogistic premise-pairs are inconcludent. In the assertoric syllogistic, these arguments consist of propositions which are in fact true, but in the modal syllogistic Aristotle also gives examples with a false assertoric premise that is assumed to be true. These premises are characterized as false but not impossible or as not prevented from being true; supposing that they are realized is said to lead to no impossibility. According to Rini, Aristotle's method of proof through realization demonstrates the extent to which he embraces counterfactual reasoning in the syllogistic. Aristotle exhibits "a sureness and confidence about counterfactual reasoning" on the basis of which one might read the counterfactual notion of validity and logical consequence into the assertoric syllogistic although in fact it is formulated in a substitutional way. While this proposal is somewhat speculative, characterizing the consequence in modal contexts as counterfactual is less so, but Aristotle's understanding how contingent premises are assumed as counterfactually realized remains a controversial issue among commentators.

Marko Malink investigates the role of one-sided possibility (possibility proper) in Aristotle's De interpretatione and the Prior Analytics and its relation to two-sided possibility (contingency). Concentrating on the controversial modal taxonomies in An. pr. I.13 and De int. I.13, Malink provides a detailed analysis of these texts, arguing that Aristotle first regarded contingency as the basic sense of possibility but later revised this view when considering the requirements of the square of opposition for modal propositions and their equivalences spelt out in terms of affirmed and denied predications and unnegated and negated modes. The explication of these two squares for modal expressions is a valuable contribution to the study of Aristotle's logic. It is of some interest that whereas Aristotle's modal syllogistic focuses on contingency syllogisms instead of those with one-sided possibility, he presents the square of opposition for expressions with the latter notion of possibility and not that with the former one in the Prior Analytics. Malink states that Aristotle found negated possibilities most naturally interpreted in the one-sided sense and unnegated ones in the two-sided sense. This is explained by referring to conversational implicatures and the conventions of ordinary language.

Malink does not address modal metaphysics in this context as some interpreters do, including Robin Smith in "Why Does Aristotle Need a Modal Syllogistic?". Smith's thesis is that the origin of the modal syllogistic is Aristotle's attempt to argue against the Megarian thesis that only what is actual is possible in Met. IX. 4. Aristotle's argument is based on his theory of potencies and a distinction between potentiality and actuality. Accepting unactualized possibilities seems to require that there are propositions that are false but not impossible. These propositions are about contingencies and form the background of the logic of two-sided possibility propositions, which are the most extensive part of Aristotle's modal syllogistic. In Met. IX.4 Aristotle formulates a possibility rule read by Smith as N(p→q)→(Mp→Mq); this rule is also used in An. pr. I.15 and elsewhere in various reductio proofs. Smith associates the possibility rule with Aristotle's definition of the two-sided syllogistic possibility as "that which is not necessary but, when it is assumed to obtain, there will be nothing impossible because of this" (An. pr. I.13, 32a19-20).[1] Smith argues that while Aristotle's answer to the Megarians led him to develop the syllogisms with contingency premises, the more straightforward syllogistic logic of necessity was built on his insight into the logic of contingency. This is not the standard view, and the Megarian discussion, although often recognized, is not given such a systematic significance as Smith gives it. A small minus is that the new ideas are presented in a concise way without a discussion of other interpretations. The first part of the paper argues that while the assertoric syllogistic has an important role in Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, the modal syllogistic is not used at all in that work on scientific demonstration and apparently has its motivation elsewhere. Smith ends with a formalized Aristotelian reductio argument for the conversion of the universal negative necessity proposition. In his diagnosis of the invalidity of this argument, Smith refers to problems in the realizing clause included in the definition of possibility quoted above.

The fourth paper on ancient philosophy is Vanessa de Harven's "Necessity, Possibility, and Determinism in Stoic Thought". She discusses the Stoic definitions of modal propositions from Diogenes Laertius VII.75 and their philosophical uses, particularly from the point of view of the deterministic tendencies in Stoic thought. In dealing with the main examples, de Harven systematizes the modalities by dividing them into logical, metaphysical, and providential necessity or possibility. The relationship between the modalities of the two last types is the main issue of this informative paper. Here one might ask why speak about logical possibility if the possibility proposition is defined as "what admits of being true not being opposed externally"?

Medieval Arabic and Latin logic is the longest continuous tradition of the study of logic in history and has been an object of increasing interest in the research of medieval philosophy. In the present volume, this movement is represented by chapters on Avicenna and the Arabic tradition (Paul Thom), Peter Abelard and his early twelfth-century predecessors (Christopher Martin), and William Ockham and fourteenth-century discussions on modality (Calvin G. Normore). Thom offers a summary of the modal theory of Avicenna (d. 1037) and some later developments of medieval Arabic logic with formalizations of the views on necessity. A large part of the paper consists of formalizations of intensional and extensional necessities and their mutual relations in al-Rāzī (d. 1210). Thom states that in constructing a formalism he aims to make valid the inferences that are supposed to be valid; he does not mean to give a philosophical analysis that captures the thought of the text being analyzed. He remarks, however, that all concepts of necessity in Arabic logic are derived from metaphysics, particularly from Porphyry's Introduction to the Categories.

Historians have associated the innovative parts of Abelard's modal logic with his systematic treatment of the distinction between modalities de dicto and de re. Martin sheds light on the background of Abelard by investigating the elements of related distinctions as well as other analyses of modal propositions in unpublished anonymous treatises by Abelard's immediate predecessors. Abelard was not as original as he has been thought to be in this area; according to Martin, the new Abelardian ideas pertained to his sophisticated understanding of modal scope and negation as a propositional operator in this context. Independently of these early twelfth-century discussions, the de dicto-de re distinction became fundamental in late medieval modal logic. Another Abelardian theme that also came to be extensively studied in the fourteenth century without a historical link to Abelard was the nature of inference. Martin does not discuss Abelard's theory of validity and inference, which he has studied elsewhere and characterized as "one of the most remarkable achievements in the history of logic".[2]

Normore writes about Ockham's reactions to the new early-fourteenth-century modal theory that included conceptions of logical necessity and possibility based on consistency and compossibility for propositions referring to existent or merely possible beings. Normore sees Ockham as a conservative thinker in the sense that while he organized his modal logic mostly in agreement with the new framework, he wanted to preserve the link to the notion of power in his modal considerations. Referring to Ockham's analysis of arguments based on impossible Trinitarian propositions, Normore concludes that in Ockham's view something semantically consistent might turn out to be impossible, so that the sphere of possibility is narrower than that of consistency. Another medieval and also contemporary view of basic modality is associated with the metaphysical assumptions of the natures and identities of things, but Ockham did not regard even this as a sufficient account because of his principle that "if x is A and it is possible that x be not-A, then x can become not-A". This led him to think that necessity is basically actuality plus immutability, to accept the necessity of the past and the present, and also to criticize Duns Scotus's idea that things could be different from how they are at the very moment of their actuality in an alternative scenario. Normore presents a useful summary of the basic principles of Ockham's modal logic in an appendix. He does not comment on fourteenth-century revisions of Aristotle's modal syllogisms and the reasons for Ockham's deviation from others in the logic of necessity syllogisms. [3] Was this connected with his power-based semantics for modal propositions?

There are four papers on the early modern period, two on Leibniz and two with a wider scope on seventeenth-century developments. With the exception of Leibniz, logic was in a severe decline in that time and questions about necessity were mostly discussed elsewhere. The papers by Jack MacIntosh and Peter R. Anstey address these philosophical landscapes. MacIntosh studies the use of the notion of necessity in the proofs of God's existence by Cudworth, Lowde and Boyle as well as some ideas about demonstration in science and mathematics. By way of an introductory orientation to early modern applications of the notion of necessity, MacIntosh begins with a survey of the senses of necessity in Aquinas, which include self-evidence, tensed necessity, absolute necessity, and necessary existence. MacIntosh compares some principles in the proofs for God's existence by Cudworth and Boyle with the modal axioms of Brouwer and S4 modal logic.

Anstey lists five theses about necessity to which most seventeenth-century thinkers were committed. These include two metaphysical assumptions about things and their essences and three epistemological assumptions as follows: we can have epistemic access to some necessary facts, this knowledge about the world is foundational, and it can generate new knowledge. This overview provides a frame for discussing the widespread disagreement among seventeenth-century authors about the nature of essences and the manner in which we gain epistemic access to modal facts. Having described various positions in these debates, Anstey goes on to take a closer look at the philosophy of Locke and his epistemic views. It is argued that Locke's knowledge of Newton's physics made him realize that natural laws can be regarded as modal facts that generate new knowledge in their own right.

Brandon C. Look analyzes Leibniz's basic definitions of necessity and possibility and their relation to Leibniz's "two great principles of all reasoning": the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason. He argues that Leibniz's theory of per se modality and the infinite analysis account of modality are complementary and, contrary to what is argued by some commentators, his approaches to necessity and contingency can be easily translated into possible-worlds semantics without transworld identity. Look also comments on Leibniz's modal proof for God's existence based on S5 modal logic. Leibniz calls the basis of this proof a splendid theorem, which is a pinnacle of modal theory and shows the way from potentiality to actuality with respect to necessary beings.

Jonathan Westphal also defends the coherence of Leibniz's conceptions of modality. He addresses the contrary view that the infinite analysis account is wrong because of an argument by Robert Adams that was later called "The Lucky Proof". Assuming that an infinite number of properties are contained in the complete concept of Peter who denied Jesus, one could think that putting the property of being the denier of Jesus first in the list identifies the subject as well as the infinite list. Westphal's point is that this may establish that someone denied Jesus but not who he was.

The last part of the book includes chapters on Kant, Peirce, Lewis and Carnap. Nicholas Stang analyses Kant's complicated ideas about logical and real modalities, the distinction between formal and empirical real possibilities, and Kant's view that all real possibilities must be ultimately grounded in a necessary being. We are rationally required to assume that there is an absolutely necessary first ground of real possibilities, but we do not know whether such a being exists.[4] In their chapter, Catherine Legg and Cheryl Misak account for various aspects of necessity and possibility in Peirce's semantics, epistemology, logic and modal metaphysics. Edwin Mares reviews the history of Lewis's classical modal systems and his various semantic interpretations of his modal systems. The papers on Peirce and Lewis include comparisons with possible-worlds semantics. Max Cresswell considers what motivated Carnap to develop modal logic. He argues that Carnap's views about meaning postulates and analyticity could have enabled him to give a better answer to Quine's criticism than what he provided in terms of individual concepts.

The editors do not say whether the papers eventually changed their discussions about modal matters mentioned in the beginning. I think that readers may be surprised by the amount of the direct and indirect impact of Aristotelian views on the interchangeability of modal expressions, the inference rule for propositional modal logic, and modal reductio proofs. Many new principles of late medieval modal logic, nested modalities in early modern metaphysics, and Leibniz's modal theories show similarities with developments of the last century. But even apart from these connections, the collection offers well-informed and intellectually stimulating analyses of various historical approaches to logical and conceptual modalities.


[1] See also J. Rosen and M. Malink, 'A Method of Modal Proof in Aristotle', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 42 (2012), 179-261.

[2] C.J. Martin, 'The Development of Logic in the Twelfth Century', in R. Pasnau and C. van Dyke (eds.), The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 139.

[3] See H. Lagerlund, Modal Syllogistic in the Middle Ages, Brill, 2000.

[4] See also N. Stang, Kant's Modal Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2016.