2017.06.22

Jerrold Levinson

Aesthetic Pursuits: Essays in Philosophy of Art

Jerrold Levinson, Aesthetic Pursuits: Essays in Philosophy of Art, Oxford University Press, 2016, 197pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198767213.

Reviewed by Derek Matravers, The Open University


Although he has published a monograph (Music in the Moment (Cornell University Press, 1998)) the journal article is Jerrold Levinson's favoured vehicle for disseminating his research. The present volume is the fifth collection of such articles. This does enable him to spread his interests far and wide, and this volume has papers on a wide variety of topics. Six are broadly on the nature of aesthetics: 'Farewell to the Aesthetician?', 'Aesthetic Contextualism', 'Towards an Adequate Conception of Aesthetic Experience', 'Artistic Achievement and Artistic Value', 'Artistic Worth and Personal Taste', and 'Beauty is Not One: The Irreducible Variety of Visual Beauty'. Two are essay-length reviews of others' books: 'Emotional Upheavals' (on Martha Nussbaum's Upheavals of Thought: The Intelligence of the Emotions (Cambridge University Press, 2003)) and Paisley Livingston's Art and Intention: A Philosophical Study (Oxford University Press, 2005)). Two are on the philosophy of film: 'Seeing, Imaginarily, at the Movies' and 'Sound in Film: Design versus Commentary'. Finally, there are three that sit on their own: a further defence of Levinson's favoured view of hypothetical intentionalism, a quirky piece on falling in love with a book, and a more substantial piece on immoral jokes. Seven of the thirteen pieces are published here for the first time.

The scope is to be welcomed. Levinson's has a knack of articulating interesting views on a range of topics in essays which soon become required reading. Hence, it is useful to have them collected here in one place. The re-statements, updates, and replies to critics on well-known positions of his are valuable. That said, the collection is a little uneven. At least one of the pieces, 'Farewell to the Aesthetician' is rather slight and another, 'Seeing, Imaginarily, at the Movies' was first published way back in 1993. I shall say something about Levinson's replies to his critics on hypothetical intentionalism, something about the other papers, and then look at where the 1993 paper sits in the current debate.

Hypothetical intentionalism, at least in the form favoured by Levinson, is the view that works of literature or cinema

constitute utterances, ones anchored in particular agents and contexts . . . whose meanings are not rightly identified, even in part, with what meanings those agents actually intended to convey in those contexts, but rather with what meanings it would be most reasonable, on a combination of epistemic and aesthetic grounds, and in light of all interpretively admissible evidence, to ascribe to such agents as intended (p. 144).

He replies to three critics of this view, Livingston, Stephen Davies, and Robert Stecker, and, to this reader at least, Levinson carries the day. On the front foot, he poses his own problem for those who think it is the actual intentions of the creator that determine meaning. The only actual intentions are those that have been successfully realised (I shall put aside worries one might have about this). However, determining which intentions have been successfully realised presupposes we are able to determine the meaning of the work without recourse to actual intentions (p. 154). While granting the strength of the argument, I wonder whether, in some instances, this begs the question against the actual intentionalist (or, at least, an actual intentionalist of some stripe). Consider interpreting paintings -- indeed, the thought might not generalise to other art forms. Levinson's counter argument does not allow the possibility that interpreting a work just is a matter of retrieving actual intentions. That is, interpreting a painting is the activity of sifting the manifest actual intentions for various degrees of success or lack of success. We do this sifting by examining individual intentions against the background of the constellation of realised mental states -- outside of this activity, there is no way to determine success or lack of success.

'Farewell to the Aesthetician?' looks at three different pretenders to the aesthetician's crown: the cognitive scientist, the critic, and the creator of art. Levinson has no trouble in showing that, whatever the expertise of these pretenders, they at most overlap with, rather than exhaust, the expertise of the philosophical aesthetician. 'Toward an Adequate Conception of Aesthetic Experience' claims that some meat can be put on the bones of the common sense notion that there is some experience that it is widely thought that artworks provide: 'Aesthetic experience is experience involving aesthetic perception of some object, grounded in aesthetic attention to the object, and in which there is positive hedonic, affective, or evaluative response to the perception itself or the content of that perception' (p. 39).

'Artistic Achievement and Artistic Value' argues that the artistic values of a work of art, even those such as originality, ultimately connect to valuable experiences or experiential enrichment. 'Artistic Worth and Artistic Value' picks up on Levinson's celebrated paper on Hume.[1] It considers, and resolves, 'the paradox of aesthetic perfectionism': that if one perfects one's taste by following the ideal critic, one would lose one's individual aesthetic personality (p. 66). 'Falling in Love with a Book' considers why we fall in love with some books and not with others.

A more substantial piece is on the philosophy of humour, 'Immoral Jokes'. Here Levinson argues that immoral jokes are indeed immoral, but are also funny. Furthermore, their being funny does not redeem their immorality. 'Beauty is Not One', another substantial piece, argues that there is no unified concept of beauty; rather, it comes in a variety of forms such as the beauty of works of art, human beauty, and natural beauty. These are not simply different manifestations of a single underlying phenomenon, but can be distinguished on intentional, structural, and phenomenological grounds (p. 115). The nature of the emotions is explored through the discussion of Nussbaum's Upheavals in Thought, mentioned earlier.

The final pair of essays are those on the philosophy of film. 'Sound in Film', distinguishes sound in film in a variety of ways; in particular 'sound as design' and 'sound as commentary': 'Sound as design means sound considered as part of the complex audiovisual aesthetic object constructed by the filmmaker. Sound as commentary means sounds considered as conveying something about the image track or visual portion of the film' (p. 175). The paper finishes with an extended analysis of the sound-track of Jean-Luc Goddard's Masculin-Feminin.

I shall finish by discussing 'Seeing, Imaginarily, at the Movies'. This considers the claim that, in watching films, audiences imagine they are watching the events portrayed. Gregory Currie had questioned this, maintaining instead that film-goers merely see visual signs and recognise and interpret them as such. Currie has a number of arguments against the view. One is that films can depict unseen events, such as a murderer entering a room. The others stem from the claim that if we imagine we are seeing events depicted, we need to imagine we occupy the point of view from which the events are seen. A host of implausibilities follow. If the film depicts a couple making love, we need to imagine we are by their side watching them. If the film depicts the earth from deep space, then we need to imagine we are, somehow, suspended in deep space. If the film depicts a battle, we are to imagine we are in the heat of battle, and consequently that we are in danger, and so on.

Levinson's reply to the first option is to restrict the scope: we imagine the events are unseen 'by denizens of the film-world' (p. 165). As for the second, he suggests that although we imagine seeing from the perspective of a given shot, we do not imagine we physically occupy that perspective. That is, we imagine we are somewhere in the space of the films events, but the sight of those events is being presented to us by some unspecified means (p. 167-68). This, says Levinson, has 'both the phenomenological ring of truth' and provides 'a more natural and convincing explanation of the immediacy of our involvement in, and our extraordinary capacity to be affected, cognitively and emotionally, by cinema viewing' (p. 173). Levinson concedes that, sometimes ('when the editing in a film is too insistent or rapid, or if there are too many extreme close ups, or if in general the sense of a film as the product of camerawork and composition, of technique and manipulation is too obtrusive' (p. 171)) we view the film as Currie proposes. Generally, however, we 'imagine seeing the events of the cinematic story unfold' (p. 172).

One might dispute Levinson's solution on its own terms. Is it really part of what we imagine as cinema-goers that we are being presented with images via some bizarre mechanism? Levinson suggests that no particular mechanism features in the content of what is imagined (we need only imagine it is by some 'unspecified means') but makes a suggestion as to how this might be filled out: 'a system of infinitely extendable and moveable mirrors that convey the sight or vision of X to any other position in the spatial world to which X belongs' (p. 168). George Wilson also holds that what we imagine seeing are 'iconic shots of the fictional events in question' transmitted by some indeterminate mechanism. His example of what such a mechanism could be is the 'space-o-scope' from the old Flash Gordon serials.[2] It is possible that even having an unspecified mechanism as part of the content of what we imagine might be something that Currie finds problematic.

The real issue, however, is that two different claims are being conflated. The first is a claim about what cinema audiences do -- imagine seeing the events unfold (call this, as Levinson does, 'the participation thesis' (PT)). The second is a claim about the nature of depiction -- that what it is to see a pictorial representation of an X is to imagine, of our looking at the representation, that it is a looking at an X (call this 'the depiction thesis' (DT)).[3] There are a number of positions on could hold: PT and DT, PT and not DT, not PT and DT, and not DT and not PT. From other work, we know that Levinson does not hold DT.[4] Thus, we can assume that, contrary to the position he appears to be defending in the paper, Levinson holds PT and not DT. If this is right, Levinson is simply wrong in taking himself to defend Kendall Walton (p. 163). Walton certainly holds DT, but it is not clear that he need hold PT (see below). This becomes apparent in the course of the paper when Levinson acknowledges that Walton is not able to follow Levinson in conceding that Currie's view might well be right on certain occasions (p. 172). As DT is a claim about pictorial representation, it will always hold.

A bigger problem for Levinson is that if one holds DT, that might be enough to account for the intuitions pushing us to hold PT. Levinson thinks this is not right -- there are intuitions left over: 'a further degree of involvement' in addition to viewing a representation (p. 172). But is this right? If, as DT holds, we are already imagining of our looking at the screen that it is a looking at (say) a woman playing a piano, do we need, in addition, to imagine we are looking at a woman playing a piano? That does not seem likely. However, as we have seen, Levinson himself rejects DT and thus for him at least, the intuitions in play give him reasons to hold PT.

We have accounted for three of our options. Levinson appears to be defending PT and DT, but in fact he holds PT and not DT. Walton (I suspect) holds not PT and DT. What of the final option -- neither PT nor DT? That is, cinema-goers are not necessarily imagining anything: rather, they are veridically perceiving a visual representation. Of course, this would need to be supplemented by an account of visual representation that did not rely on DT. If we did have such an account, it is entirely possible that the intuitions in support of PT would vanish, and the fourth option would emerge as correct.

Despite the occasional disagreement I have, this volume is, as I hope to have made clear, a welcome addition to the Levinson corpus, and a valuable reminder of the range and depth of his work in aesthetics.


[1] 'Hume's "Standard of Taste": The Real Problem', Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 60 (2002), 227-38.

[2] George Wilson, Seeing Fictions in Film, (Oxford University Press, 2011), p. 48.

[3] This position is famously associated with Kendall Walton. See Mimesis as Make-Believe, (Harvard University Press, 1990).

[4] See his 'Wollheim on Pictorial Representation' in Contemplating Art, (Oxford University Press, 2006) pp. 239-51.