2016.05.02

Elizabeth Brake (ed.)

After Marriage: Rethinking Marital Relationships

Elizabeth Brake (ed.), After Marriage: Rethinking Marital Relationships, Oxford University Press, 2016, 247pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190205089.

Reviewed by Raja Halwani, School of the Art Institute of Chicago


This short yet stimulating collection of nine new essays tackles questions surrounding marriage that remain even though, or because, same-sex marriage is on its way to becoming legal and fully accepted (at least in the western and some other parts of the world). The essays differ in their strength and incisiveness (though all are good), but all succeed in raising crucial questions about marriage.

The first two essays tackle the issue of whether the state can remain neutral about the good life while also supporting marriage. Simon Căbulea May, in "Liberal Neutrality and Civil Marriage," argues that we should think of marriage as a presumptively permanent relationship: "a type of small-scale inter-personal relationship in which the participants are socially expected to commit in good faith at the outset of the relationship to its permanence" (p. 15). Such a relationship tends to have good effects on its participants and others, and the state can support it while remaining neutral, as it is not championing marriage as a matrimonial ideal or an ultimately superior type of relationship.

Ralph Wedgwood defends marriage against liberal attackers in "Is Civil Marriage Illiberal?" His main point is that the state can remain neutral by supporting a thin conception of marriage. Marriage law reflects, stabilizes, and reinforces the social meaning of marriage: sexual intimacy, economic and domestic cooperation, and a commitment to the relationship. State backing of marriage communicates this social meaning to society when X and Y marry. In societies in which marriage has been a tradition, people have made it a central part of their lives. Thus, given that marriage need not produce harm and is compatible with justice, marriage is justified.

Wedgwood criticizes the view that the state's backing of the usual understanding of marriage violates the rights of polygamists or those wanting to be part of group marriages. He responds that "polygamy's troubling history" makes it "reasonable for us to treat these risks as a reason against allowing polygamy" (p.42), and that with group marriages the communicative power of marriage weakens considerably: "it would not actually be possible for groups that have more than two members to be included in a legal or institutional relationship that had the core social [meaning] of marriage as we know it" (p.43). These replies, however, neglect the fact that monogamous marriage also has a troubled (sexist) history, and that marriage's meaning can be widened to include the communication of the commitment among, say, five people. If Wedgwood desires to defend a thin albeit monogamous conception of marriage, these questions require clearer treatment.

Clare Chambers' "The Limitations of Contract" is a sobering and refreshing reminder of the perils of thinking that marriage can be easily substituted with contracts drawn by the parties to the union. Although contracts have their advantages (e.g., freedom, equality, and diversity), they are problematic in three ways. First, if the parties to a contract are unequal, the terms of the contract might reflect this inequality. Second, parties to a contract might not include clauses pertaining to crucial areas in the relationship. Third, contracts between two parties do not impose regulations on third parties (e.g., children). Thus, it is clear that the state needs to intervene to regulate these contracts: "First, the state needs default directives for those cases where regulation is needed but no contract has been made. Second, the state needs principles and limits of contract law, setting out what makes a valid contract and the recourse for breach" (p. 60; "directive" is the state-dictated "responsibilities and rights, in advance and for all relevant people" [p. 52]). Parties to a contract should have some leeway, according to Chambers, in adjusting these directives to their own case, as long as the leeway does not undermine the very same justice the directives are meant to secure.

According to Chambers, however, the directives themselves should be piecemeal, and should avoid bundling separate regulations, such as those regarding child-care, property, and immigration, so as to contain the sought-after diversity that different couples can help themselves to. Thus, Chambers adopts a middle approach between current state regulation and all-out contracts: the state should have a role in marriage-like contracts, ensuring their equality and fairness, but one that allows for a good measure of freedom and diversity for the parties involved.

Samantha Brennan and Bill Cameron's "Is Marriage Bad for Children?" argues that our legal and cultural institutions should distance themselves from the belief that there is or ought to be a strong connection between marriage and parenting, and "to think about children, rather than romantic love, as another possible foundation for the family" (p. 84). The authors provide a list of goods (e.g., stability, security, a steady source of needed resources, and intimate nurturing relationships) that non-marital arrangements can supply, and for which marriage is not necessary (even sometimes "detrimental, "p. 87). They provide sketches of how parenting would look without marriage or love, such as people with ongoing interests and commitments to rearing children, including friends who share such interests and commitments.

Even though I mainly agree with the position, it would have been more interesting had the above models been filled in more or had the authors discussed the type of contracts that would have existed in such parenting arrangements (this is especially true in light of Chambers' essay; one wishes that the editor had required these essays to be more in dialogue with each other), or had the authors told us why a move away from marriage and towards more focus on parent-child relationships "is likely to foster creativity, openness, and thoughtfulness" (p. 95).

Elizabeth Brake ("Equality and Non-hierarchy in Marriage") aims to "develop a feminist ideal of egalitarian relationships modeled on friendship" (p. 100). She is opposed to a specific type of hierarchy, in which one spouse alienates her decision-making power to the other, or in which one spouse is overall dominant in the relationship (these two are not identical -- a spouse may be dominant without the other alienating her decision-making power). It is important to defend non-hierarchy in marriage because, unlike other institutions where there is giving up of decision-making power, marriage involves all aspects of each person's self (as opposed to, say, being a member of a club which involves only some aspects of a person's self) and is, for all intents and purposes, life-long (unlike, say, being in the military, where giving up decision-making power is usually temporary).

Thus, given the nature of marriage, giving up decision-making power in it is especially problematic. Although sometimes a spouse might defer to the other, whether on a particular decision or on a type of decision (e.g., who decides what to cook), the crucial thing is that this deferral be an expression of the autonomy of the spouse deferring his decisions, and not a total giving up of decision-making power. Thus, what is problematic in hierarchical relationships is that their kind of decision-making alienation undermines autonomy.

Brake chooses friendship as a model for two reasons (though it is not clear that she herself sees them as separate). First, friends interact as equals. Second, friends have aspects to their lives separate from the friendship (these two are not the same because parties to a relationship might have separate aspects to their lives yet still treat each other equally or unequally). Given the threat to autonomy by the hierarchical form of marriage, and given that friendships preserve the autonomy of the parties to the relationship, friendship serves as a good model for nonhierarchical marriage. (Where this leaves romantic love, which is often the basis of marriage, and its own autonomy-numbing powers, is an interesting question.)

Peter de Marneffe ("Liberty and Polygamy") argues that polygamy should be decriminalized though not necessarily legalized, and that there are good reasons against legalizing it. He argues convincingly that if we have no good reason to criminalize adultery and fornication (even though they might be morally wrong actions), we have no good reason to criminalize polygamy, given that it also is a form of sexual freedom. Our rights to sexual freedom imply that criminalizing polygamy is wrong.

This does not mean that polygamy should be legalized. Indeed, there are reasons not to legalize it. First, polygamous relationships are not ideal for children. Second, such relationships are in conflict with romantic love, which tends to not accommodate more than two people (De Marneffe provides evidence that polygamous relationships are rife with jealousy and other negative emotions). Third, monogamous marriage promotes what de Marneffe calls "exclusive life partnerships" which are a human good. Since polygamy does not seem to promote this good (especially in light of the evidence presented), we have no reason to legalize it. (de Marneffe also cogently argues why not legalizing polygamy does not violate state neutrality.)

Laurie Shrage's "Polygamy, Privacy, and Equality" argues that the main arguments against polygamy fail to convince, and that polygamous legal unions can be "structured in ways similar to civil monogamy, so that their impact on gender equality and marital privacy would be, at worst, neutral and, at best, empowering for all involved" (p. 161). The state can create programs that minimize the gendered impact that marriage can have on spouses (e.g., creating paid leave programs for parents but such that each parent should use the leave equally). Moreover, the spouses would have equal claim to property (acquired during the marriage), the same exit rights, and basically the same set of rights. No spouse "would have exclusive claim to another's spouse's affection or share of that person's economic assets" (p. 166).

Regarding privacy and intimacy, Shrage raises the issue of whether polygamy "translates" into less control over one's personal information, space, and decisions. With monogamy, when things go bad, the stakes are high because much of our personal information lies in the hands of one other person, whereas polygamy has the advantage that our happiness is not "in the hands of just one close companion" (p. 169), as one can turn to other spouses to help solve a problem. (But if the problem were irresolvable, the sensitive information would still be at risk of being released by the soured spouse, a possibility that Shrage forgets). Shrage's answer is rules, which exist in monogamous and polygamous relationships, that allow the relationships to function:

Given that both monogamous and polygamous families can develop and articulate adequate rules for protecting the informational, spatial, and decisional privacy of all members, I don't think that the contention that the latter are inherently less stable can be maintained (172).

Shrage's essay is highly general. Its basic claim is that polygamous marriages could work. This is true. But the interesting issues with polygamy are the details. If the state is going to intervene to regulate them, this sounds like a bureaucratic nightmare. (At one point, Shrage suggests that the state could issue a single marriage license to a polygamous unit. But what happens if one spouse wishes to exit the marriage? Will the whole thing fall apart? Will the rest have to remarry each other?) Stating that rules could exist to help is true, but what these rules are and whether they will work is the interesting question. The essay is not only short on proper evidence and detail (compare it, for example, to de Marneffe's that has much detail about polygamous relationships, or Chambers's that has much detail about state regulation of relationships). It also ignores the psychological issues that arise with love and relationships, which might make Shrage's beloved rules almost useless. There are also the questions of whether issues of privacy can be reduced to issues of controlling information, and whether privacy and intimacy are the same, given Shrage's inter-changeable treatment of them.

Daniel Nolan ("Temporary Marriage") argues that the state should recognize temporary marriages -- marriages that end at a pre-specified date ("due to expire after a fixed amount of time," p. 180). There are various reasons for state recognition. First is the equality principle: unless there is good reason otherwise, the state should recognize a marriage that two people are in or are about to enter. Second, temporary marriage plays an important role in some cultures; Nolan's main example is the mut'ah (roughly, "pleasure") marriage practiced in many Shi'ite communities (of course, this second reason is convincing mostly for those societies). Third, temporary marriages have benefits. Like "permanent" marriages, they allow their partners to celebrate them in ceremonies with their loved ones. More importantly (and a point that Nolan should have emphasized more), temporary marriages might allow the spouses to not take each other for granted, to give them the opportunity to review and to perhaps renew the marriage, and, to give a third benefit, to allow people to enter into marriages with more honest promises ("until forever" might not be a promise honestly made by all couples).

This is an interesting essay and Nolan is probably right about most of his conclusions, but sometimes there is a breezy feel to the arguments. For example, in addressing the objection that temporary marriages might not be good for the children of such marriages, Nolan responds that the research might show that their children would fare as well or as no worse than other marriages or arrangements. Of course this is true. But the point is whether the research would bear it out. Nolan gives a similar type of answer to legal and social issues (e.g.,what laws would regulate such marriages? Would social expectations differ -- should I start courting Omar now knowing that his marriage is due to expire in six months?), which is that none of these issues seem "serious obstacles" (p. 195). He's probably right about some (the legal issues, I worry, will prove somewhat tough, especially those surrounding immigration), but the essay would have been richer if he delved into one or two issues at greater length. Still, the idea of temporary marriage is crucial and needs to be in cultural circulation. My hunch is that most people would shy away from it, because they might think it reflects their lack of seriousness or deep love. But were it to be implemented, with time it might allow couples to be more honest with each other about their expectations of each other and of love. It might help curb procreation ("I'm not having a child if our marriage is only for five years!"), something that we should all be doing anyway.

In the final essay ("The (Dis)value of Commitment to One's Spouse"), Anca Gheaus raises doubts about the value of the commitment of marriage, especially in relation to preserving the love between the spouses. While commitment to a person reflects love (because it is a commitment to the person's happiness and wellbeing), commitment to marriage is commitment to the relationship, not necessarily to the other person in the relationship. The interesting point is that Gheaus raises possible doubts about what many people accept as true: that one of the principal goals of marital commitments is to secure the love between the spouses.

Gheaus accepts the claim that commitments are instrumentally good: they are good insofar as they secure the goods to which one is committed. Commitments, moreover, are costly in that in being committed one agrees to forego other possibilities (this is the price of commitment). Thus, it is better if one can secure the goods without the commitment. While marriage can help secure certain goods (e.g., familiarity with someone, raising children, and economic stability), it is not suited for romantic/sexual love, given that love requires (according to Gheaus) a crucial form of spontaneity. The aim of intimate relationships, including love, is

the journey itself. Merely enjoying the company of another and allowing oneself to be changed by relating to another give value to intimate relationships. For this reason, a lack of commitment is less costly when it comes to intimate relationships than in other contexts, such as learning a language (p. 219).

This claim, interesting as it is, might rely on a narrow conception of commitment, especially when it comes to love, and on a controversial view of love. Although most commitments have instrumental value, this is not true of all, especially love-commitments. Gheaus writes as if love is one good among many in marital commitments (thus enabling her to ask whether this commitment is a good way to securing it), whereas one can view marital commitments as expressions of love, as requirements for love, as its embodiment, or as its enactment. These might be highly romantic ways of thinking about marital commitments (at least those whose main reason is love), but if they have an ounce of truth to them, they indicate that marital commitments to love cannot be easily seen as merely instrumental.

The above point remains plausible even if we accept Gheaus's controversial view of love. She minimally understands "love" as "the inclination to seek another's companionship and advance her well-being" (p. 215). Gheaus seems to think that such a view of love means that X loves Y as a result of X's "spontaneous reaction" to Y, thus that X continues to love Y "independently of the history of [the] relationship" (p. 218). It is as if X sees and understands Y, and reacts with feelings of love to Y. This view of romantic/sexual love is highly benign, even idealized, especially in the face of much writing on love that emphasizes its darker aspects, such as its possessiveness and its frenzy (in these respects, romantic love is different from other forms of love). If such views are plausible, romantic love might be best surpassed for a more settled stage of familiarity and nesting (in which case the instrumental value of commitments becomes worthwhile, if the partners elect to nest with each other) or one foregoes romantic love altogether, in which case marital commitments for love becomes a moot issue.

The essays in this book vary in their degrees of convincingness, and some could have directly addressed issues raised by others. Yet every single essay raises crucial questions about marriage. For this reason alone, and, of course, for others, the book is a welcome and valuable addition to the writings on marriage.