Reviews » Archive » March 2011

Mark Jary


Reviewed by Peter Pagin, Stockholm University


Richard Vernon (ed.)

Locke on Toleration

Reviewed by Ingrid Creppell, George Washington University


Timothy O'Leary, Christopher Falzon (eds.)

Foucault and Philosophy

Reviewed by Ladelle McWhorter, University of Richmond


Randall E. Auxier, Lewis Edwin Hahn (eds.)

The Philosophy of Richard Rorty

Reviewed by Paul Redding, The University of Sydney


Milad Doueihi

Augustine and Spinoza

Reviewed by Carlos Fraenkel, McGill University


The Cambridge Companion to Dewey

Author: Molly Cochran (ed.)

John Dewey (1859-1952) was America's leading public philosopher for well over half a century. His collected writings take up thirty seven volumes, with several additional volumes devoted to lecture notes provided by his students, and three volumes of correspondence, all published by Southern Illinois University Press. Thus it is inevitable that any collection of writings about Dewey and his thought will be incomplete. In particular, while Dewey's engagement as a public philosopher is mentioned both in Robert Westbrook's intellectual biography and Richard Bernstein's and Molly Cochran's discussions of Dewey's vision of democracy, his public philosophy receives no sustained attention comparable to his epistemology and logic, for example. Given Dewey's commitment to the ideal of philosophy as a tool for resolving the "problems of men," this is a significant lacuna. That said, however, the collection of essays in Cochran's The

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Sympathizing with the Enemy: Reconciliation, Transitional Justice, Negotiation

Author: Nir Eisikovits

The renewed interest in Adam Smith as a philosopher is partially fueled by the need to develop a philosophically sophisticated method for communicating across cultural differences. Smith's account of sympathy in The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS) provides a flexible framework for imagining the situations and perspective of others, and many find his eighteenth-century approach useful for twenty-first-century problems. Martha Nussbaum used it as a basis for judicial compassion in Poetic Justice

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Plato and the Talmud

Author: Jacob Howland

Diverse readers should find in Jacob Howland's comparative study many appealing features, though its title is not among them. It implies misleadingly that two vast corpora which have no obvious relation to each other are to be discussed generally. Howland, however, wisely concentrates on just two Platonic dialogues -- the Apology

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The Promise of Democracy: Political Agency and Transformation

Author: Fred Dallmayr

Fred Dallmayr's project is to develop theoretic resources adequate to correct minimalist conceptions of democracy that he thinks are undermining political association in our time. He finds help in the work of John Dewey, various strands of postmodernism, and the work of political analysts who are thinking about whether and how Islamic and Asian societies can transform themselves into successful democratic associations. In pursuit of these objectives, he works with highly abstract texts such as those of Hegel, Heidegger and Derrida and in more situationally centered thought.…

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The Self-Organizing Social Mind

Author: John Bolender

Sociability is one of the most fascinating traits of our species. As human beings, we create and participate in complex social structures with a flexibility of group membership which is unparalleled in the animal kingdom, and we are capable of entertaining a seemingly endless variety of social relationships. What if underneath our dappled social world lies a deeper kind of simplicity, which can be explained by the physics of symmetry and its breakings, akin to the processes which are at work in the formation of a snowflake or a spiral galaxy? In his insightful new book, John Bolender argues that such a view is indeed suggested by contemporary science rather than a figment of social romanticism.…

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Art and Aesthetics After Adorno

Author: Jay M. Bernstein et al.

The title of this volume of papers recalls a famous essay by the conceptual artist Joseph Kosuth, "Art After Philosophy" (1969), in which Kosuth cheerfully turned Hegel on his head: "The twentieth century," he wrote, "brought in a time which could be called 'the end of philosophy and the beginning of art.'"[1]

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An Unprecedented Deformation: Marcel Proust and the Sensible Ideas

Author: Mauro Carbone

According to Maurice Merleau-Ponty, our epoch is marked by the struggle to overcome the famous Platonic distinction between the sensible and the intelligible, and this struggle can be seen first and foremost in art and literature. In the words of Mauro Carbone, professor of aesthetics at the University of Milan: our epoch aims at "a different description of the relationship between the sensible and the intelligible" and thus at "a new theory of ideas" (p. 9). In discussion with Merleau-Ponty and Gilles Deleuze

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Confronting Evils: Terrorism, Torture, Genocide

Author: Claudia Card

This impressive book, a successor to the author's The Atrocity Paradigm (2002), brings a sharply critical gaze to a wide range of topics. Part II comprises six chapters in which particular evils are confronted: both counter-terrorism and terrorism are discussed, the latter embracing "low-profile" violence such as rape; the recent torture debate is incisively analyzed, and the notion of torture extended to rape, elder abuse, and the cruel treatment of animals; an account of the specific evil of genocide is offered, and of the pathologically paradoxical enterprise of genocidal rape. It is impossible to read any of these chapters without a sense that one's perspective has been enlarged and one's sense of the critical issues enhanced. Whether or not the book as a whole is as strongly compelling as its parts, however, must inevitably depend on the reader's judgment about the coherence and identity of the idea of evil itself. Although some take the view that the idea was born in now-distant theology and is sustained mainly by vulgar political rhetoric, Claudia Card maintains that it continues to have a secular, coherent, and non-rhetorical use as a condemnatory term: we can best evaluate her claim on the basis of the chapters in Part I, which are more general in their scope.…

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Spirit, the Family, and the Unconscious in Hegel's Philosophy

Author: David V. Ciavatta

In the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel famously argues that self-consciousness depends essentially on the recognition of others and that active engagement in practices of recognizing and being recognized by others is a necessary condition for being an agent or a self. In recent years, interpreters have worked to couple Hegel's early treatment of reciprocal recognition with the account of rational institutions that Hegel offers in the Philosophy of Right

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Feminist Interpretations of Richard Rorty

Author: Marianne Janack (ed.)

(A) It is objectively true that women should not be oppressed.

(B) We must work to overcome the oppression of women.

Are A and B opposed? These claims undeniably represent a difference in emphasis, one seeking to describe reality and the other to alter it. But if feminist progress is best obtained on a non-foundationalist approach to truth, the difference between A and B is substantial. Richard Rorty argued that neo-pragmatism better advanced feminism's aims than did representationalist philosophical approaches, and Marianne Janack has collected ten essays that examine the import of those arguments.…

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