2017.11.05

Darren Hudson Hick

Artistic License: The Philosophical Problems of Copyright and Appropriation

Darren Hudson Hick, Artistic License: The Philosophical Problems of Copyright and Appropriation, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 231pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226460246.

Reviewed by Brian Soucek, University of California, Davis


Darren Hudson Hick is a rarity: a sophisticated philosopher of art who understands and cares about the law. His new book has a lot to teach philosophers about how the law both protects authors' rights and limits them, often to protect others who want to sample, quote, adapt, or appropriate existing works within their own. Philosophers of art who care about artistic practice can learn, not only from Hick's rich and varied examples, but also from his account of one of the great forces shaping that practice. Hick's account of copyright is sometimes descriptive, sometimes revisionary, and thus has something to teach lawyers as well. But deciding exactly what lessons the law, with its own distinctive interests, should take away from an account like Hick's -- focused as it is on philosophical clarity and responsiveness to current artistic practice -- is itself a philosophically interesting question, and one I wish Hick's book went even further in answering.

Hick's central question -- Is it wrong for one work to copy another? -- requires him to consider five "interdependent metaphysical and ethical issues" within "the institutional, cultural, and legal framework of intellectual property" (48). They are:

(1) the nature of the works in question, (2) the relationship of the author to the work, (3) the rights of the author and how they arise from this relationship, (4) the relationship holding between the original work and the potentially infringing work, and (5) the rights of nonauthors -- if any -- with regard to a given work (48).

This, then, is the agenda for Hick's book, or at least most of it. Somewhat disconcertingly, the agenda-setting passage above doesn't appear until page 48. First comes an Introduction devoted to Hick's terrific cover image: commercial artist Mick Haggerty's mash-up of Mondrian and Mickey Mouse -- an example I would have loved Hick to reconsider at the end of the book as a test of his account of what appropriation is appropriate. The next two chapters are similarly introductory. Chapter 1 offers examples ranging from Shia LeBeouf to blues music, hip-hop culture to college plagiarism, to make a point that I doubt will surprise anyone willing to read a book-length study on copyright and appropriation: namely, that while artistic making has long been bound up with artistic taking, "remix culture" seems to have accelerated with modern technology. More interesting to me was Hick's observation that some takings are illegal but not immoral (think of a short sample of a drum break), while others -- like biologists' use of Henrietta Lacks' cells -- are immoral but not illegal. This sets up a broader discussion in Chapter 2 about the relationship among artistic practice, philosophy, and copyright law, which regulates and incentivizes certain artistic practices, and makes certain ontological and ethical conclusions. More on this soon.

The book's main line of thought begins in Chapter 3, and it goes, in outline, like this (with my comments in brackets):

(1) an author of a work is one who has and exercises the power of selecting and arranging elements as constitutive of that work [see Chapter 3, which argues against those who find authorship and originality passé, and Chapter 4, Hick's own account of authorship];

(2) this creative activity determines the nature of that work (in general, an authored work is a type instantiable in multiple tokens) [see most of Chapter 5];

(3) this creative activity and the nature of the work give rise to the author's ownership of the authored work -- a natural right to determine the conditions under which that work can be copied [Chapter 6];

(4) copying another author's work (where the properties of the new item are shared with and depend on those of the preexisting work) without permission constitutes prima facie infringement [see the end of Chapter 5]; and

(5) though copyright is a natural right, it is not thus an absolute right, and what qualifies as a nonviolating use (copying) of an author's copyrighted work depends on some interest or right of the user outweighing the natural right of copyright [Chapters 7 and 8] (164-165).

I have, of course, just quoted -- which is to say copied -- this summary of Hick's argument from Hick's book itself. And according to the quoted argument, this constitutes a prima facie infringement. Perhaps my lawyers, or NDPR's, should be concerned. But wait! Hick's unexpectedly witty copyright notice at the start of the book gives permission "to reproduce brief quotations from the book for the purposes of critical articles and reviews. Beyond that," he notes, "things quickly become less clear. See chapter 7 . . .". (I would note that things only "become less clear" because Hick invokes standard U.S. copyright protections, rather than the sometimes more permissive ones he argues for in the book. He might, for example, have explicitly granted permission for any use that complies with his theory. This would have the added benefit of allowing Hick to test his theory out in court, should any infringement occur.)

Flipping to Chapter 7's discussion of fair use, we find Hick's central argument: the claim that copying an author's expression of an idea without permission is an infringement of his or her natural right to restrict that copying, but (adopting a distinction of Judith Jarvis Thomson's) it is not a wrongful violation of the author's right if the copying is necessary (or reasonably required) to express the ideas of the copyist. This is one of the two situations Hick describes in which copying is not wrongful and should be legally permitted; the other is appropriation art, which Hick would allow whenever the copied material is used to express a different idea from that of the original.

So, does my quotation above wrongfully violate Darren Hudson Hick's natural right as an author? Several of my chief comments about Hick's book are related to this question.

For starters, I don't quite know the answer. Or, rather, and reassuringly to NPDR's legal staff, I'm fairly confident about the law's answer, but I'm somewhat less sure about Hick's. U.S. law will almost certainly protect me because of the transformative nature of the use and its unlikely effect on Hick's book sales. My confidence here belies Hick's overstated claim that American "fair use doctrine offers effectively no predictive value, and (perhaps worse) sets no reliable precedents" (123). Hick's own test, by contrast, although promising "a principled schema that would offer predictive value to potential copyists" (137), raises questions: was a quotation as long as mine necessary? Was I just lazy? Should I have offered instead my own description of Hick's argument? (Copyright covers only Hick's expression of these ideas, not the ideas themselves.) On Hick's test, my need to copy, and thus its permissibility, seems to hinge on factors like whether I intend to criticize Hick's writing. (In fact, I don't; although the book's style varies from chapter to chapter -- "Can we talk for a minute about Shia LaBeouf?" (9) versus "if some item, W1, has the properties <a1, t1, p1> . . . " (93) -- Hick writes well in both voices.) Quotation would be more necessary if I were trying to give readers a sense of Hick's style, not just the outline of his argument.

Perhaps, though, I am framing the question in the wrong way. Maybe we should look not to my (i.e., the user's) intentions, but to the secondary work itself -- here, this review -- in determining what amount of copying is necessary. Hick has surprisingly little to say about the theory of interpretation that copyright law should adopt in deciding whether a work's copied material was needed, or, in appropriation art, whether the secondary work expresses a distinct idea from the original. This is an area where a philosopher of art, like Hick, could really enlighten courts and legal scholars who have sometimes struggled to understand and choose among intentionalism, formalism, or other interpretive approaches.[1]

These recurring mentions of appropriation art underscore the fact that Hick's book, from its title onward, is very much a book about art. This is hardly surprising: Hick is a philosopher of art, after all. But notice that the passage quoted at length above is in no way limited to artists and artworks. Its talk of "authors" and "works" applies equally to decidedly non-artistic works like this review, to computer software, to boat hulls, and, as the Supreme Court recently told us, to the chevrons on cheerleaders' uniforms. Hick's attention to this distinction leads to one of my favorite moments in his argument.

In Chapter Five, Hick develops, in careful, compelling detail, his ontology of authored works. His account allows us to distinguish multiple works from multiple instantiations of one authored work, and new works that infringe from those that do not. To summarize part of a longer argument: one authored work is distinguished from another if "it has different composite elements or . . . its composite elements have distinct causal bases" (99). If it has the same elements and causal bases, it doesn't matter that that they express different ideas. This isn't true of artworks, however; Hick follows Arthur Danto in suggesting that these have their meaning, or "aboutness," essentially. The result: a piece of appropriation art (say, a Sherrie Levine photograph of a Walker Evans photograph) may be a new artwork, even though it is not a new authored work.

Hick's interesting ontological conclusion leads to a question for the law: should copyright follow artistic practice and allow for perceptibly indiscernible, causally connected (rather than fortuitously similar) artworks? Hick's proposal, in Chapter 8, is that appropriation artworks like Levine's should be allowed as fair use if they express "some idea distinct from that of the original" (159). But this fair use allowance should not bring with it the right to make other copies, or to license further derivative works (158).

Here is a place where Hick's focus on art really matters. His account of appropriation art is revisionary, and end-driven: he seems to assume that appropriation artists like Levine and Richard Prince should be legally permitted to do what they do; copyright law should be revised to make that so. Because appropriation art has become "one of the most fascinating -- and most influential -- movements in contemporary art" (160), Hick wants the law to "seek to find a way of accommodating" it. But why? Surely appropriation art is no more fascinating or influential than fashion design, though the latter goes largely unprotected under U.S. copyright law. Many things we value -- graffiti, civil disobedience -- are not just unprotected, but forbidden by the law. For some of these, their illegality is part of their power. Hick's focus on art, surely a small minority of the copyrighted material in the world, perhaps skews his view on what practices it is especially important for copyright to accommodate.

This brings me, finally, to Hick's claim that authors have a natural right in their original works. Hick rejects the theory of intellectual property enshrined in the U.S. Constitution: an instrumental theory which justifies copyright as an incentive for creative activity that expands the marketplace of ideas. Copyright protections are neither necessary nor sufficient for achieving that end, Hick argues: Homer didn't need it, and Shakespeare would have been hindered by it. Copyright's effectiveness as an incentive to creativity is ultimately an empirical question (106) -- though note, here again, that the empirics should take account of not just art, but many other creations as well. And while copyright's exclusion of fashion is often defended because incentives are less needed there -- copied fashions lead to obsolescence, which spurs new design[2] -- Hick's natural rights argument on behalf of authors should apply fully to fashion design and many other kinds of making as well. I wonder how revisionist Hick is ultimately willing for his theory to be.

This is the question that kept coming back as I read Hick's book: his admirable attempts to make copyright law more coherent, and more firmly grounded, necessarily create tension with the law as it currently exists. That's to be expected. The law lacks philosophy's focus: its interests are often multiple, and sometimes conflicting. Consider, for example, the practical suggestions that Hick offers in the book's Afterword. Recognizing that his revisionary account of fair use for appropriation art might "open the door to widespread piracy," Hick suggests limiting it to appropriation artworks that sell for twice the price of the original, with a requirement that half the sales price goes to the original's creator. If all we cared about were the natural rights of the (original) author, this might work. But Hick's proposal would have a horribly disparate impact on appropriation artists: it would apply when famous artists like Richard Prince take from no-name creators, but not the other way around. To quote two legal scholars, it offers "fair use for the rich and fabulous."[3] Compared to current copyright law, Hick's theory may be more consistent and, perhaps, more predictable, but that is partly because he sidesteps, in this book at least, the distributional and egalitarian interests that I, for one, want copyright law to serve.

Back to my initial question, then: what should the law take from Hick's philosophically rich account of copyright? This depends, I think, on whether and when his conceptual analysis is taking account of the interests of philosophy, or of the artworld, or of the law. Admittedly, these interests will often overlap: as Hick notes (34), philosophers have increasingly aimed at an ontology of art that responds to actual artistic practice -- which is to say, one that incorporates the interests of artists. Similarly, Hick's arguments about why fair use (and, I would add, substantial similarity) cannot hinge solely on artworks' appearance (160) is an example of philosophy bringing conceptual clarity to the law on the law's own terms: the claim is that looking beyond appearances serves the very interests copyright law is meant to advance. (Of course, what those interests should be is always up for dispute.) But, just as the interests of graffiti artists are often in tension with those of property law, those of appropriation artists might not be consonant with those of copyright law. What is needed is an argument for why copyright law, by its own lights, should seek to accommodate the Sherrie Levines and Richard Princes as well as much less known appropriation artists.

This is a provocative, generative book. My comments here are less criticisms than invitations for further work, especially further thinking on the relationship between philosophy of art, artistic practice, non-artistic creative practice, and the categories and values that the law adopts in protecting those practices (or not). Reading this book, however, assures me that Darren Hudson Hick is one of the scholars whose further thoughts on these issues I would most like to hear.


[1] See, e.g., Amy Adler, Fair Use and the Future of Art, 91 N.Y.U. L. Rev. 559 (2016); Robert Kirk Walker and Ben Depoorter, Unavoidable Aesthetic Judgments in Copyright Law: A Community of Practice Standard, 109 Nw. U. L. Rev. 343 (2015); Alfred C. Yen, Copyright Opinions and Aesthetic Theory, 71 S. Cal. L. Rev. 247 (1998). Professor Adler describes how courts employed three different interpretive approaches in one case: Cariou v. Prince, 714 F.3d 694 (2d Cir. 2013), which is also one of Hick's primary examples. For my own views on these issues, see Brian Soucek, Aesthetic Judgment in Law, 69 Ala. L. Rev. ___ (forthcoming 2017).

[2] See Kal Raustiala and Christopher Sprigman, The Piracy and Paradox: Innovation and Intellectual Property in Fashion Design, 92 Va. L. Rev. 1687 (2006).

[3] Andrew Gilden and Timothy Greene, Fair Use for the Rich and Fabulous?, 80 U. Chi. L. Rev. Dialogue 88 (2013).