2017.09.22

Stephen Gaukroger and Catherine Wilson (eds.)

Descartes and Cartesianism: Essays in Honour of Desmond Clarke

Stephen Gaukroger and Catherine Wilson (eds.), Descartes and Cartesianism: Essays in Honour of Desmond Clarke, Oxford University Press, 2017, 217pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198779643.

Reviewed by Marcy P. Lascano, California State University Long Beach


This collection of essays, dedicated to the work and memory of Desmond Clarke, focuses on four aspects of Cartesian studies: Cartesian science, mind and perception, actions and passions, and Cartesian women. The twelve essays generally take their cue from two approaches to Descartes studies that Clarke advocated in his own work: (1) the importance of understanding works like the Discourse on Method and Meditations on First Philosophy in light of Descartes' work as a whole, but, in particular, in reference to his work in natural philosophy, and (2) that much can be gained by examining the ways in which Descartes' close contemporaries received his views and worked out difficulties therein. Many of the essays approach their topics very much in the way that Clarke suggested. The result is a collection that skews towards attempts at understanding Descartes' views in light of his natural philosophy and the examination of his works through his predecessors.

The volume has no introduction or abstracts for the articles, although there is a short preface acknowledging Clarke's impact on the evolution of Descartes studies, so this review will outline the arguments of the chapters.

John Schuster takes up the view (held by Clarke, Buchdahl, Sabra, and Laudan) that Descartes' corpuscular-mechanical explanatory model has a necessarily hypothetical character. Shuster develops a heuristic model of Descartes' natural philosophical system, picks out what he takes to be the core of Descartes' system, and details the way the various components interact. He examines how Descartes developed his natural philosophy, beginning in his early work The World. From there, he focuses on Descartes' views on vortices, magnetism, and sun spots, to arrive at Descartes' mature systemizing strategy, as found in the Principles of Philosophy.

Susan James takes two questions from Clarke. First, is Descartes' method applicable to physics, mechanics, medicine, and morals? Second, is the method applicable in the sense that there are people who possess the qualities necessary to put the method into practice? What follows is an adept discussion of the relationship between scientific and moral practice. James first lays out the Cartesian method for constructing scientific explanations and demonstrating conclusions. She then argues that, in order to master the scientific method, a practitioner must cultivate her attentiveness, judgment, and feelings. This involves conforming the will to our best-supported perceptions and cultivating a "firm and constant resolution" to use our will to the best of our abilities, knowing that we are blameworthy when we fail to do so. This is to say, we must develop the central Cartesian moral quality of generosity in order to properly practice Cartesian science.

John Cottingham begins with a discussion of methodology in the history of philosophy, praising the contextualist turn advocated by Clarke, while allowing that "worthwhile" history of philosophy is "sensitive both to nuances of history and context, and to the enduring philosophical significance of the ideas studied" (44). Those who take Clarke's advice to look forward to the Cartesians in contextualizing Descartes' work have provided great insights, but Cottingham urges us also to look backwards to Descartes' influences. Cottingham examines Descartes' use of the image of light in the Meditations, pointing out its religious context in its various forms and uses throughout the text. His study culminates in the claim that the natural light of reason has no justification without the supernatural light of faith to ground it.

Galen Strawson argues that the notion that Descartes held a concept of the mind as a thinking substance not wholly constituted by mental goings-on is false. Rather, the mind simply is conscious mental goings-on. Strawson argues that we should take seriously the claim that a substance is its primary attribute, as we do seem to recognize in the case of body as mere extension. He is careful to note that these mental goings-on are not passive processes, but "live, dynamic, active, and powerful" (69). Strawson advocates a broad view of the mental powers essential to mind. He argues that while it is true that minds are capable of sensation and imagination only when united with a body, the fact that they have this power when so united is explained by the fact that this power is essential to mind. However, Descartes' thesis of the transparency of the mind causes problems. For it is clear that we are not manifestly aware of all the mental goings-on that must be included in a Cartesian account of mind, viz., powers of reason, will, imagination, conceptions, memories, etc. How can we account for the "ontic depth" of conscious processes? Strawson suggests that the transparency of the mind thesis fails, and that something like Leibniz's petites perceptions might be the best solution.

Catherine Wilson attempts to solve the puzzle of Descartes' seemingly contradictory conclusions concerning sense perception. The first conclusion is that external things exist and that the senses reveal them to us. The second is that the senses do not reveal the world because they do not reveal the causes of appearances, which are unknowable to the senses. Wilson seeks an answer to the question of what constitutes true, or veridical, perceptions for humans by showing that the problem is analogous to the problem of normativity (deriving 'can' from 'ought') and must be solved in a similar Gricean way. This involves seeing humans as properly functioning sensory machines, and tests may be devised to determine whether they meet some standard of adequate functioning. With this in place, Wilson is able to provide a normative account of misperceptions, optical illusions, and cases of 'seeing as' as 'false perceptions'.

Erik-Jan Bos investigates the extent to which Regius followed Descartes concerning the relation of information between mind and brain and the way mind moves body. Bos notes that in the Treatise on Man, Descartes offered an account of "inverse transmission," where the image from the pineal gland flows to the interior surface of the brain rather than the other way around, which is absent in the Dioptrics and the Passions of the Soul. However, Bos argues that Descartes did not change his mind about this view. In a letter to Mersenne from 24 December 1640, Descartes explains that the pineal gland is the distributer of animal spirits in the brain, and this would not make sense if Descartes did not maintain that the pineal gland was also the origin of the animal spirits. Bos shows in what respects Regius' account of perception is similar to, and differs from, Descartes' views, as expressed in the Treatise on Man. Next, Bos traces the "Leibnizian" interpretation of how the soul moves the body -- that the mind does not change the movement of the body, but only determines its direction. Here, Bos provides further evidence for the view that Regius interpreted Descartes in the Leibnizian manner and is the source of Princess Elisabeth's understanding of Descartes' view. This chapter also contains an appendix with a translation Regius' letter concerning the true seat of the soul.

Stephen Gaukroger argues that Descartes' account of vision based on optical instruments (telescopes, camera obscuras) is largely to blame for the view that we only perceive mere representations of the external world rather than the external world itself. Gaukroger argues that the key mistake lies thinking that radiant light from stationary objects is resolved into an image on the retina in a passive process. Our current understanding of visual cognition shows that this image actually requires a lot of interpretation in order to generate what we experience in our visual cognition. Descartes' model leads to the idea that vision occurs internal to the perceiver, and that we have no direct contact with the outside world. Gaukroger describes at least five ways in which the optical instrument account goes wrong, and argues that visual perception is more akin to touch, which Descartes and other 18th century philosophers saw as unmediated contact with the world. Gaukroger argues that extramission views of vision (where the eye emits "visual rays" that come into direct contact with objects) should be favored over intromission views, since vision occurs in the world as an integrated sensory-cognitive package.

Delphine Antoine-Mahut asks the question, "is there such a thing as a material idea for a Cartesian?" Of course, this depends on what a Cartesian is, and on how Cartesians understand the term 'idea.' The contemporary caricature of Descartes might make one answer the question in the negative -- ideas, as forms of thought, belong to the immaterial soul. Of course, those familiar with Descartes' Treatise on Man and Optics will insist that there is a more complicated story to be told about the formation of our ideas that often involves physiological processes. By investigating La Forge's commentary on Descartes' Treatise and la Forge's Treatise on the Human Mind, Antonie-Mahut presents a Cartesian who was aware of the ways in which the physiological side of the story was neglected and how this omission was obscured by Descartes' own Meditations, with its emphasis on immaterial ideas. These two factors led to a rise in the estimation of the arguments made by materialists, like Thomas Hobbes, and to a low evaluation of Descartes' responses to Hobbes' objections in the Meditations. Thus, we can see why La Forge takes up the task of clarifying Descartes's overall account of the formation of ideas and his use of terms like 'images' and 'ideas.' La Forge's efforts served to ward off the caricature of the Cartesian account, to clarify the extent to which body (or matter) plays a role in our ideas, and to show the extent to which Hobbes' objections must be taken seriously and can be rebuffed.

Alexander Douglas argues that Descartes does not have, and believed it impossible to have, a theory of human action. Douglas examines Descartes' replies to Elisabeth's questions about the possibility of the mind moving the body. Turning to Descartes's primitive notions, he argues that motion as understood under the notion of extension is intransitive motion, and that the notion of motion as transitive (in the sense of moving x or being moved by x) can only be understood under the primitive notion of the union. However, the primitive notion of the union is not a philosophical account. He submits that Descartes developed the notion of the soul as corporeal, a category "to which volitions and motions both belong," when it is conceived as part of the union, and that this serves to make the interaction between mind and body, and seeming spatial location of the soul in the body, less mysterious. However, no explanation is provided for how an immaterial entity becomes corporeal. Douglas then discusses how various Cartesians understood motion.

Theo Verbeek illustrates the similarities and important differences between Regius' Dissertation on the Affections of the Soul and Descartes' account in The Passions of the Soul. Verbeek argues that Regius' need for medical explanations, as well as his rejection of Descartes' metaphysics, provided Regius' account with much that is original while still maintaining its Cartesian nature. While Bos' essay focused on the mechanics of perception and volition, Verbeek's focus is on the nature and purpose of various passions. Verbeek also seeks to show that Regius' account was an unlikely source for Spinoza's view of the passions.

Denis Kambouchner extends Clarke's account of will and pure understanding as faculties "of the soul" that depend on the body, to an account of the soul's power. Kambouchner argues that the soul does not move the body to diminish a currently occurring passion through volition. Rather, the imagination plays a central role. The soul produces an idea (hopefully one that has been previously cultivated as a habit) that involves that object of that idea as an image on the pineal gland and the interior of the brain, which activates the animal spirits to produce action. Making use of the preface to the unfinished (1648) The Description of the Human Body, Kambouchner argues that the soul cannot produce motion in the body without "the appropriate disposition of the bodily organ" (184), and then considers the implications of this controversial claim.

Finally, Detlefsen explores the ways in which Descartes' metaphysics and method inspired aspects of Astell's feminism. In a nod to Clarke's translation of works on the equality of men and women, Detlefsen argues that we can, as Clarke did, attribute the designation of 'feminist' to thinkers like Astell. She takes her cue from Nietzsche's (parenthetical) remark that "only something which has no history is capable of being defined" (193), and argues that the concept of feminism might have different meanings in different historical contexts. Detlefsen argues that Astell posits two types of feminism in her works. One is grounded in Cartesian metaphysics, viz., the equality of the sexes based on the non-sexed nature of our rational souls. The other is a type of feminism that values female-coded traits like community, friendship, love, and proper self-regard. This later type of feminism can be seen in Astell's proposal for an all-women's religious retreat. In laying out Astell's views on women's education, Detlefsen compares Rousseau's notions of proper and improper self-love with Astell's own use of these notions, and contrasts Rousseau's impractical, and neither ideal or non-ideal, theory of education with Astell's non-ideal theory that attempts to overcome barriers to women's development.

As noted at the beginning of the review, one of the themes in this volume is how we can understand Descartes' philosophy by reference to his natural philosophy. This is done very well in a number of ways. We get a clearer idea of what Descartes' methodology in natural science looks like and gain insights into his views on perception, motion, and the relation between the passions and natural philosophy. While there are several essays that touch on Spinoza, Malebranche, and other Cartesians, it is Regius who becomes a clearer figure to those of us unfamiliar with his works. The two chapters on Regius fit together well, and provide adequate resources for those interested in further research on this understudied figure. While several chapters mention Elisabeth's correspondence with Descartes, praise must be awarded to Detlefsen's chapter for acknowledging the profound effect that Descartes' metaphysics and method had on women's arguments for equality.[1]

One of the most pleasing features of this collection is the rather striking, and often controversial, nature of the theses being defended. There is no doubt that the authors have detailed knowledge of Descartes' corpus and a deep understanding of the issues involved in their subjects. The claims are controversial: that Descartes has no theory of action, that minds can only affect bodies with suitably disposed organs, that the thesis of the transparency of the mind should be rejected, that there is no substance of mind over and above mental goings-on, that only the most virtuous can properly engage in Cartesian science, or that we can derive a sense in which feminism can apply to a figure in different ways in different historical contexts based on a parenthetical remark by Nietzsche. But they are not put forth for the sake of being controversial. Rather, they are the result of a holistic and careful understanding of the texts. It seems clear that many of these essays would not have seen publication through our now too conservative journal editorial or peer-review process. Though well-justified and well-argued, these claims go against the grain of the traditional stories we tell (and write) about Descartes, so would have faced strong opposition from a review process that largely rewards small steps.

That said, there is something that the current state of our professionalized review process does ensure, viz., the citation of relevant contemporary literature. Someone who picked up this volume with the hopes of understanding the "current state of scholarship" (Preface, v) in Cartesian studies would be forgiven for concluding that there has been very little work produced since the early 2000s.[2] It is odd that a volume containing works on the passions would not engage with the work of Lisa Shapiro or Gary Hatfield, for instance. Likewise, Cottingham's reflection on the theological aspects of the Meditiations would surely have been enriched by Christia Mercer's study of the meditative tradition in Teresa of Ávila and Descartes. It is clear that the authors wanted to focus on those topics that most benefitted from Desmond Clarke's work, and this was done very well. However, there should still have been space enough to engage with a bit of the work from the last dozen years or so, and in particular, the work of junior scholars.


[1] Praise also should be given to Desmond Clarke not only for his own work on these issues, but also for his encouragement of others in recovering seventeenth century women philosophers.

[2] Verbeek's chapter mainly concerns Henricus Regius, and Verbeek notes the only study of Regius he is aware of in the text. In addition, Detlefsen's chapter cites the most up to date literature on Astell. Strawson's chapter engages with Marleen Rozemond's work.