Ernest Sosa


Ernest Sosa, Epistemology, Princeton University Press, 2017, 235pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691137490.


Reviewed by Adam Carter, University of Glasgow

This is, among other merits, the best epistemology textbook for advanced undergrads of which I'm aware. It certainly starts off with a bang: right from the first chapter, Sosa more-or-less tells you that much of what you've taken for granted about Descartes' epistemological project in the Meditations is mistaken -- or at the very least, overlooks key pieces of the picture that, once in place, help to unlock Descartes' deeper agenda. On Sosa's preferred, Pyrrhonian-style virtue-theoretic reading of the Meditations, the notions of judgment, aptness, and competence take centre stage in Descartes' project, as does the distinction between two very different levels, first-order and second-order, of epistemic performance (and, accordingly, of belief).


And with different kinds of belief, functional and judgmental, in play, the Cartesian epistemological project is accordingly interpreted as sensitive to interestingly different kinds of error, as well as different kinds of knowledge, animal and reflective. Each of these has a different role to play in the Cartesian methodology that Sosa takes as a starting point in the book.


Over the course of the book's 13 chapters, a compelling case unfolds for thinking that grappling with properly epistemological questions inescapably requires two levels of analysis. Sosa advances this narrative with a focus on his most recent angle of presentation in Judgment and Agency and its emphasis on judging -- viz., affirming with the endeavour to affirm with alethic aptness. At the same time, he manages to thread in classical and contemporary epistemological problems ranging from scepticism to the Gettier problem, the relationship between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism, parallels to action and perception, the value of knowledge, Kripke's dogmatism puzzle, synchronic and diachronic rationality and the recent empirical challenge from epistemic situationism (among other relevant topics).


It is a real challenge to read this text without being lured into embracing wholesale Sosa's programme, even if doing so means giving up on the traditional project of analysing knowledge, construed in the standard, univocal fashion. The all-things-considered explanatory power of Sosa's bi-level picture is really hard to ignore. This is, I think, at least in part because Sosa brings together in clear view the key features of his overarching bi-level virtue epistemology which have -- prior to the publication of this book -- been spread out across decades, from 1991's Knowledge in Perspective through his 2005 John Locke Lectures, published as A Virtue Epistemology (2009, 2011), 2010's Knowing Full Well and 2015's Judgment and Agency.


That said, I want to spend the remainder of this review registering, in some detail, three key points of criticism. These concern (1) Sosa's critique of Zagzebski's theory of knowledge, (2) the place of non-epistemic factors in competence possession and how Sosa's thinking on this topic connects with his thinking about background conditions, and (3) Sosa's conception of the relationship between drugs, enhancement, and fully apt performance. Each criticism is intended in the spirit of encouraging further development of what is overall a rich and explanatorily powerful view that hangs together remarkably tightly.


Sosa vs Zagzebski


Zagzebski (1996) insists that intellectual character virtues (e.g., open-mindedness, etc.) must play a central role in accounting for all human knowledge. In the case of immediate sensory knowledge, which doesn't seem essentially due to any obvious praiseworthy character trait, Zagzebski suggests that one's getting it right in such cases is nonetheless a matter of appropriate non-negligence. Sosa's reply here is interesting:


However, we cannot explain the appropriateness of a belief that a room has suddenly gone dark as a matter of non-negligent agency if that belief is not at all a product of intentional agency, which is the sort of agency important to character epistemology. Surely motivation relates to agency, not to passive reactions that approximate or constitute mere reflexes (148).


Sosa then develops this point further with a contrast case:


Suppose one's locomotive stays on track, despite one's having actively intervened not at all. One might still deserve credit even so if there have been junctures where as conductor one could have intervened, where one was free to intervene, and, without negligence, freely opted not to do so. Unfortunately, this will not do. The problem is that in the cases urged by the critics, there is no freedom to intervene in what seems clearly to be a belief, and even an instance of knowledge, as when one knows that the room has gone dark (148).


Sosa's discussion in the first passage risks running together the notions of agency and voluntariness in a way that will be contentious, at least to some. For example, John Hyman (2015), has recently argued that "agency and voluntariness are different phenomena, and the distinctions between active and passive and between voluntary and involuntary cut across each other" (2015, 7). If we allow (à la Hyman) for possible combinations of involuntary activity and voluntary passivity, it's debatable whether Sosa's argument (with the contrast case of the locomotive) establishes a lack of agency in the dark room case of the sort he needs against Zagzebski.


But setting that more general issue aside, it's worth focusing on the claimed disanalogy Sosa presses in the second passage between

  1. the presence of the freedom to intervene (in the locomotive case) when one does not in fact intervene; and,
  2. as Sosa characterises the case of believing the room goes dark, a lack of the freedom to intervene.

But is there really no freedom to intervene in the latter case, unlike in the locomotive case? On a first pass, it seems the person in the dark room was free to do something that would bear on how she would form the target belief -- e.g., had a person a standing, epistemically vicious motivation (e.g., had she wished to have been altogether insensitive to whether the room had gone dark when it did), she was free to have worn sunglasses or otherwise to have perceptually incapacitated herself. A relevant question then becomes: is this freedom (to have perceptually incapacitated herself) sufficiently enough like the freedom to have intervened in the locomotive case to close the gap between Sosa's claimed disanalogy? Sosa might insist it is not, because the agent in the dark room case (and unlike in the locomotive case) was not free to intervene vis-à-vis the formation of the belief at the relevant time (i.e., when the room goes dark), and that on this basis the belief (unlike in the locomotive case) can't be due in any way to non-negligent agency. But a counter-reply waits: it does seem possible to exercise non-negligence and not be free to intervene at the time, as in the case of Ulysses pacts -- viz., when you freely chooses to constrain yourself at some future time. Sosa may well be right that easily acquired knowledge poses a problem for Zagzebski's proposal (in fact, I think he is). However, the details of the argument might need further work.


Competence, knowledge and pragmatic encroachment: a tension?


A belief whose correctness manifests competence is apt belief (animal knowledge); a fully apt belief is not merely apt, but it's also guided to aptness by the believer's assessment of risk through a competent view of his own (first-order) competence. A competence is, on Sosa's view, a disposition to succeed (reliably enough) when one tries (see esp. Chapters 6 and 12). What Sosa calls a complete competence has a triple-S constitution – seat, shape and situation -- with reference to which three kinds of dispositions can be distinguished. In the example case he offers concerning driving competence, these are, first, the innermost competence (i.e., seat) that is seated in one's brain, nervous system, and body, which one retains even while in poor shape (e.g., asleep or drunk) (191), second, the inner competence (seat + shape) which requires also that one be in awake, sober, alert, and so on (191-2), and, third, the complete competence (seat + shape + situation) to drive well and (on a given road or in a certain area), which requires also that one be well situated, with appropriate road conditions pertaining to the surface, the lighting, etc. The complete competence is thus an SSS (or an SeShSi) competence (191-2).


What shape counts as the proper shape and what counts as being well situated? Who decides? Relatedly, is there a competence that corresponds with every conceivable seat/shape/situation pairing? Sosa's answers to these questions are related. He says that


Not every disposition to succeed when one tries constitutes a competence  . . .  although every competence will be constituted by a disposition to succeed when the agent is within certain ranges of shape and situation. A disposition to succeed is thus plausibly made a competence by some prior selection of shape/situation pairs such that one seats a competence only if one is disposed to succeed reliably enough upon trying when in such a shape/situation pair. Whether a particular shape/situation pair is appropriate will, of course, vary from domain to domain of performance (195, my italics).


The relevant pre-selection here is a matter of (in short) what we care about. We don't test for an (innermost) driving competence by asking whether one is reliable enough at driving when one has drunk a gallon of wine and would be driving underwater because we are not embedded in a community that values reliable performance in such a shape/situation pair.


Sosa's claim that what a community values circumscribes the kinds of shape/situation combinations that feature in distinguishing genuine competences is a plausible one (see also his 2010b). That said, I want to highlight a potential tension in Sosa's thinking (I say 'potential' because it is possible he has a principled answer here) that emerges when we combine the line just sketched with two other aspects of Sosa's wider view: (i) his metaphysical claim about what constitutes knowledge (e.g., Chapter 9; cf., Chapter 4), and (ii) his thinking about how background conditions interface with knowledge (Chapter 13).


The metaphysical claim I have in mind is that exercising competences doesn't merely (as intellectual trait virtues do) put one in a position to know; it also actually constitutes knowledge (e.g., 140-144; cf., Ch. 4). When we combine this claim with the previously noted claim that competences themselves are partly distinguished by the kinds of seat/shape pairs that we value, what follows is an interesting, albeit nonstandard, form of pragmatic encroachment on knowledge. Sosa doesn't use this term himself, but he seems to recognise such a result when noting that knowledge and other kinds of human achievement are 'inherently normative' (205) in the sense that


they are successes that manifest competences, where competences are dispositions involving pre-selected shape/situation combinations wherein specifically human accomplishment is prized (or otherwise of special interest) (205).


As I mentioned, I think there is a possible tension in Sosa's thinking, and it involves the strand of pragmatic encroachment his view implies, just described, in conjunction with a certain kind of 'purism' Sosa opts for later in chapter 13.


To appreciate the kind of purism I have in mind, consider the example Sosa offers of a basketball player who performs in conditions that require lighting (e.g., a gymnasium that is lit up to compensate for the lack of windows and sunlight). On Sosa's view, the player's shot is fully apt if it not only manifests a first-order shooting competence, but moreover is guided to aptness by the shooter's assessment of risk through a competent view of his or her own shooting skill, shape and situation. But what does such a competent view of one's skill, shape and especially situation involve, for the performance to be fully apt? Here's Sosa:


The athlete needs to consider various shape and situation factors: how tired he is, for example, how far from the target, and so on, for the many shape and situation factors that can affect performance. But there are many factors that he need not heed. It is no concern of an athlete as such whether an earthquake might hit, or a flash tornado, or a hydrogen bomb set off by a maniac leader of a rogue state, and so on. As an athlete, he is not negligent for ignoring such factors (191, my italics).


Interestingly, then, we have a distinction within the class of things that could cause a performance to fail, between (i) the kinds of things a fully apt performer must heed in order to safeguard against credit-reducing luck, and (ii) the kinds of things the performer is free to non-negligently assume are already in place. Sosa calls the kinds of things performers can non-negligently assume to be in place background conditions. As he defines these conditions:


A background condition is a condition that must hold if the relevant S is to be in place at the time of performance. Thus, the presence of the pertinent skill, shape, or situation will entail respective background conditions that must then hold. What makes such a condition a mere background condition is that, although it must hold, the performer need not know that it will hold. Nor need it hold safely. Reducing the safety of that condition would not reduce or in any way affect performance quality (218, my italics).


So, the basketball player shooting at night in a lit gymnasium can perform fully aptly even if she does not know that the lights in the gymnasium will not suddenly go off when she takes her shot, and (provided the shot is apt and guided by competent risk assessment vis-à-vis her first-order SSS conditions) the shot can be fully apt even if the lights very nearly went off but happened not to do so. But, by contrast, the shooter would not shoot fully aptly even if shooting in good shape and within her threshold for sufficient reliability were she unaware of this fact, such that she very easily could have shot outside of her threshold of sufficient reliability, and thus very easily could have shot inaptly (cf., 2015, Ch. 3 for fuller discussion).


Question: but what exactly makes the lighting system but not the fact of how far away the shooter is from the basket a background condition? A clue here is that, as Sosa says, 'It is no concern of an athlete as such' whether an earthquake might hit or (for our basketball player) whether the electricity grid powering gymnasium's lights might suddenly shut down. Likewise, in the epistemic case, it is no concern to the knower as such whether (say) the world could easily have ended but did not. As Sosa captures this idea in an illustrative example toward the end of Chapter 13, suppose a maniac equipped with a large enough hydrogen bomb could easily have caused all background conditions for all performances, epistemic or otherwise, to fail to hold. On the assumption that the maniac decides whether to ignite the bomb by flipping a fair coin, the lucky result of which leads him to refrain from mass destruction, Sosa says it 'seems implausible that human performance would be spoiled across the globe when the maniac's coin flip could so easily have gone the other way' (216).


It looks then like what is guiding Sosa's thinking about what distinguishes situational features of one's first-order SSS competence from mere background features is that the former are in some way pertinent to the performer or performance as such and the latter are not. And mutatis mutandis in the case of epistemic performance.


On the basis of what, though, is a condition not pertinent to, as Sosa puts it, the 'epistemic player,' viz., the knower, as such? Here is where I think the tension between Sosa's form of pragmatic encroachment and his remarks in Chapter 13 materialises: for if what makes a given condition a mere background condition in the epistemic case is that it is not pertinent to the knower as such, then -- if such thinking is generalised more widely -- we'd expect non-epistemic features such as what a community values to not be pertinent to a knower as such. And yet, as we've seen, for Sosa such features play a role in pre-selecting the relevant seat/shape pair with respect to which a given knowledge-constituting competence is distinguished. It would be helpful to see more clearly how these points could be clearly reconciled with one another.


Drugs and enhancement


Being in proper shape vis-à-vis driving competence requires that one be, at least, 'awake, sober, alert' (192). Being in proper shape with respect to other kinds of competences will be comparatively more demanding. Lance Armstrong, for instance, can enhance (and has enhanced) his complete SSS disposition to succeed in competitive cycling through being in drug induced shape. Is he equally competent as he would be absent the enhancement? Sosa thinks not -- viz., that Armstrong's SSS disposition does not remain a competence once Armstrong's shape is drug induced (195n2). Sosa makes a similar point concerning Alex Rodriguez, who he describes as having a 'drug-derived seat' of his baseball competence.


As we continue to rely on the latest science and medicine to improve athletic and cognitive capacities, cases such as those of Armstrong and Rodriguez -- and their epistemic analogues featuring cognitive enhancing drugs and technologies -- will be increasingly more relevant to address for any epistemologist who gives aptness and competence a central theoretical role. As Sosa has diagnosed things in passing, it looks as though (for example) Armstrong's drug-induced shape has as a consequence that he performs not at all aptly (fully so or otherwise), because he lacks the first-order competence (despite possessing the relevant SSS disposition to succeed). This might be so. But it might also be plausible that whether a given drug-induced shape can feature in a genuine competence, and, by extension, a fully apt performance, isn't going to be settled by the mere fact of enhancement.The issue may also depend on how the enhancement is being used, and -- in the epistemic case -- whether the enhancement (whatever it involves) is being responsibly integrated into the subject's cognitive architecture (Carter and Pritchard, forthcoming; cf., Pritchard 2010).


Setting aside the three criticisms raised, Epistemology, to reiterate, is a fantastic book. It is a great model of careful and deep epistemology, and it synthesizes a comprehensive and sophisticated framework developed by someone who is arguably the world's foremost epistemologist. The book should be of great value to advanced undergraduate and postgraduate students, and it should be mandatory reading for professional epistemologists as well.




Carter, J. Adam, and Duncan Pritchard. Forthcoming. ‘The Epistemology of Cognitive Enhancement’. Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 1–25.

Hyman, John. 2015. Action, Knowledge, and Will. Oxford University Press.

Sosa, Ernest. 1991. Knowledge in Perspective: Selected Essays in Epistemology. Cambridge University Press.

———. 2009. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge (Vol. 1). Oxford University Press.

———. 2010a. Knowing Full Well. Princeton University Press.

———. 2010b. ‘How Competence Matters in Epistemology’. Philosophical Perspectives 24 (1): 465–75. doi:10.1111/j.1520-8583.2010.00200.x.

———. 2011. Reflective Knowledge: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge (Vol. 2). Oxford University Press.

———. 2015. Judgment and Agency. Oxford University Press.

Zagzebski, Linda Trinkaus. 1996. Virtues of the Mind: An Inquiry into the Nature of Virtue and the Ethical Foundations of Knowledge. Cambridge University Press.