2017.10.02

Vincent Blok

Ernst Jünger's Philosophy of Technology: Heidegger and the Poetics of the Anthropocene

Vincent Blok, Ernst Jünger's Philosophy of Technology: Heidegger and the Poetics of the Anthropocene, Routledge, 2017, 153pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138737594.

Reviewed by Robert P. Crease, Stony Brook University


Ernst Jünger (1895-1998) was a writer, novelist, author, and philosopher whose significant influence on 20th century thought was twofold. The first is via his notion of "total mobilization," a description of the technological age as characterized by a wholesale transformation of human life into exploitable energies and resources. The second is via his impact on the thought of Martin Heidegger, one of the greatest of 20th century philosophers. This influence is manifested particularly in Heidegger's notion, in The Question Concerning Technology, of the Gestell or "Enframing," a mode of existence in which beings of all sorts, including human beings, appear as means towards ends. Blok's book is a narrow exposition of both of these aspects of Jünger's thought. The book explicitly refrains from considering Jünger's biographical details, his political positions, or his non-philosophical writings, but, in places, more information or discussion of these would have been helpful.

In Part I, Blok provides a discussion of The Worker (1932), the book in which Jünger advanced his idea of the technological age in terms of total mobilization. Total mobilization involves a complete disruption of society from its previous underpinnings, subjecting everything in it to efficiency and exploitation, destroying the old Enlightenment values and sensibilities and replacing them with pure technological functionality and efficiency. Total mobilization is the conversion of "life into energy." (10). It heralds a new world order characterized by nihilism, or the experience of the destruction of any connection to a transcendent source or meaning of things. Total mobilization functionalizes human beings, creating "the worker," a type of human fully adapted to the new world order. Jünger calls this transformation a "gestalt-switch," meaning by "gestalt" a new kind of unity that holds everything in its grip, yet does not itself appear in the world. This gestalt presents itself in the representation of a type that does appear in the world, as the coin punching system appears in the type of coin it mints. Part I also includes a section on Nietzsche's considerable influence on these ideas.

Blok devotes Part II to a discussion of Jünger's influence on Heidegger, such as on Heidegger's notion of the Gestell, a unity that orders things that appear but is nevertheless not itself a thing. Another place where Jünger influenced Heidegger was on the idea of nihilism. Jünger wrote of the experience of nihilism as a movement towards a zero line or meridian, but one that can, at least potentially, via a "new turning of Being," be crossed over into a new era in which nihilism is overcome (54) -- while Heidegger thought that nihilism cannot be overcome and the only recourse is a return to the question of Being. Blok, however, argues that Jünger not only helped usher Heidegger to his own position, but actually began to accomplish what Heidegger criticizes him for not doing. Blok cites a number of other points where Jünger influenced Heidegger: on the latter's notions of "overcoming," calculating, and Gelassenheit, among others. Here is one spot, however, calling for a thorough discussion of the political views of Jünger and Heidegger. Blok briefly cites Michael Zimmerman's claim that Jünger's views on total mobilization and nihilism helped convince Heidegger, in Zimmerman's words, "that only a radical new beginning, like that proposed by National Socialism, could help Germany to escape Jünger's technological forecast." (55) Much more should have been made of this observation, and of Jünger's own controversial political views. But Blok quickly brushes past these issues.

One of the most dissatisfying aspects of this book is its use of the term "anthropocene" in the subtitle and final few pages. It is not at all clear what Blok means by it. The term is often proposed as the name for an era in which human beings have a fundamental impact on the Earth's geology. But its meaning, validity, and duration are hotly contested. Some of its users place its origin in the 20th century, others in the 17th (eg, Nature 519, 171 -- 180, 12 March 2015, doi:10.1038/nature14258). Blok neglects all these controversies in ways that do not inspire confidence. He serenely assures us that "geologists announced that the earth entered this new epoch of the Anthropocene at July 16, 1945," the date of the Trinity atomic bomb test (142; the footnote does not provide a reference for this claim). He suggests that the anthropocene concept appears in Jünger's book At the Time Wall (1959) (138), identifying it as the idea that human beings are not simply in a geological layer, but, in the form of "the worker" have become a "layer-forming species" (139). But that is before the first recorded appearance of the word "anthropocene" (Blok's language appears erroneously to suggest that Jünger actually uses the word); moreover, how such concrete manifestations as atmospheric CO2 levels or atomic bomb tests relate to the gestalt of the worker is not made clear.

The book's attention to Jünger's impact on Heidegger is certainly welcome. Unless one is familiar with Heidegger's contemporaries, Heidegger's thought can seem to have appeared out of nowhere, a philosophical monadnock that rises on its own out of the Western philosophical tradition thanks to Heidegger's genius. In fact, Heidegger was a consummate synthesizer who brought together key elements from thinkers in that tradition. Jünger was one of those on whom Heidegger relied, and Blok's exposition is extremely useful in showing just how much Heidegger took, and how he transformed it. But Blok fails to put Jünger himself in context. Jünger, too, did not rise on his own, and more references to influences on him would have helped clarify not only his thought, but also Heidegger's. Max Weber, for instance, exerted a colossal influence on any German of the early 20th century who wrote about bureaucracy, war fever, the worker, calculating rationality, and the suffocating "iron cage" of the modern world, but Weber is not mentioned. More contextualization of Jünger's figure of the wanderer (which surely derives at least in part from Nietzsche), of the idea of measure (Hölderlin), and of the idea of elemental time versus mechanical time (which clearly reflects Bergson's influence) would also have helped prevent Jünger from erroneously appearing as a monadnock. Nor is there serious discussion of the existing secondary literature on Jünger. Zimmerman's discussion of Jünger is noted briefly, and Peter Trawny's is mentioned in a footnote, but from Blok's book a reader might conclude that there is little or no secondary literature on Jünger.

The book moves from considering one of Jünger's texts to another in a plodding way, giving it more the feel of a final paper in a course rather than a book. It also suffers from undue repetition, and from a large amount of pedestrian prose: "Heidegger's use of the concept of work in the period 1930-1934 is definitely positively inspired by Jünger, although not necessarily completely the same as Jünger's." (72) Several quotations from Jünger are needlessly repeated, and sometimes Blok's own words recur verbatim, once at the end of two successive paragraphs (29, 30). Confusingly, and without elaboration, "Total Mobilization" and Sicilian Letter to the Man in the Moon are each said to be "a preliminary draft" of The Worker (11, 40). Inclusion of at least some biographical details would have helped. Blok, for instance, refers to Jünger's transformative experience at the Battle of Langemarck, "in which he experienced a gestalt-switch," (7) but we learn neither when nor where this battle took place, nor what it was about the episode that so transformed Jünger. Furthermore, in a book that characterizes Jünger's way of writing as "not thinking but poetry" (28), surely it would have been illuminating to have discussed his poetry and novels, which include Heliopolis (1949) and Gläserne Bienen (1957).

One final quibble: the index is atrocious. None of Jünger's own books, not even those discussed at length in the text, are cited. There are entries for Spengler, Nietzsche, Hitler and Hölderlin, but none for Plato, Aristotle, Heidegger, and Zimmerman; the difference between the two lists of names has nothing to do with frequency of occurrence.