This is the first of two volumes collecting Parsons' interpretative work. Its first half contains four essays on Kant and a substantial Postscript relating them to more recent scholarship. Its second half consists of two essays on Frege, each followed by a Postscript; one essay on Brentano and one on Husserl. It does not include the classic papers from the 1960s reprinted in Mathematics in Philosophy.
Parsons' virtues as an interpreter are on display throughout the volume. Theses put forth on behalf of other thinkers are carefully worded, and attributions not clearly supported by the texts are marked as conjectural. Parsons stands out for the sensitivity with which he brings formal advances to bear: when he uses a result or technical regimentation to clarify a position, he qualifies its relevance by considering whether it would have been understood by the thinker in question. This can lead to sharp disagreement with other interpreters (William Tait, for example). A further respect in which Parsons takes historical figures on their own terms is that his engagement with their positions is not conditioned by expectations of viability. He gives as much consideration to Brentano's term logic, and to Kant's account of our knowledge of Euclidean geometry's necessity, as to views with obvious contemporary relevance.
The essays on Brentano and Husserl do not directly concern philosophy of mathematics. In a Preface Parsons describes the two essays on Frege as "distinctly less ambitious" than "Frege's Theory of Number" and "not focused on larger issues concerning [Frege]'s logic and philosophy". The essays on Kant are not accompanied by disclaimers (except for one described as "small" (p. x), which comments on a paper on Kant's philosophy of science), and are in any case distinguished by their importance and ambition. I will discuss the contents in this order, so as to close on issues of the broadest significance for philosophy of mathematics.
1. Phenomenology: Husserl and Brentano
The essays on Brentano and Husserl have a thematic continuity that explains why Parsons grouped them together, rather than relegating the former to the next volume (on twentieth-century philosophers). As Parsons explains in the Preface, these essays originated in invitations to write on specific topics, so it is not surprising that they range somewhat afield of the concerns driving the rest of his work. But Husserl's theory of perception serves as a connecting thread.
"Brentano on Judgment and Truth" poises its subject between traditional Aristotelian logic and modern theories of truth. Unlike his contemporary Frege, Brentano cleaves to the traditional conception of judgment as an instance or outcome of an agent's judging. He understands what is judged as a "presentation", which corresponds to the traditional logical notion of a term (S or P in "S is P"). But for Brentano, judgment is not (in the first instance) a combination of presentations. It is rather the affirmation or denial of one, so that "in a sense all judgments are existential judgments or negations of existential judgments" (p. 164). Parsons presents Brentano's view as a "brave attempt" (p. 164) to give presentations enough structure -- without committing judgers to metaphysically suspect objects -- that every traditionally recognized form of judgment can be seen as affirming or denying a presentation (as a whole). Brentano's device for eliminating negation from the content of what is judged is "double judgment", in which an agent first "accepts" the existence of something, then affirms or denies something of it. Parsons raises a difficulty for this notion: the acceptance of a "definite", particular instantiation of F-hood seems to be required for affirming or denying something of an F, even if the existence of F's can be affirmed without it. (With Brentano's turn to reism, the problem of how to understand affirmations of general terms arises more generally.) For Brentano, presentations can be conjunctively or disjunctively structured. Parsons shows that if Brentano allows within presentations both negation (as he does at an initial stage of analysis) and a parthood relation for conjunctive objects, his logic suffices to express first-order monadic quantification.
Parsons explains how "Brentano's thought on truth develops out of his thought on judgment" (p. 178). Brentano's rejection of the combinatory view of judgment undermines the correspondence theory of truth as formulated by Aristotle (in terms of thinking what is separated or combined as separated or combined). His conception of judgment as an affirmation or denial gives correspondence theory the burden of specifying objects to correspond with denied presentations. And Brentano's reism requires him to reject the objects introduced (at one point, by Brentano himself) to correspond to true judgments. In later writings, he intimates that formulating truth-conditions in terms of correspondence leads to regress. Nonetheless, Parsons shows, Brentano was reluctant to give up a correspondence account. He finally breaks with it by characterizing truth in terms of "evident" judgment, where every agent who evidently judges a particular presentation must judge it the same way. The most serious difficulty facing this account seems to be the possibility of presentations with regard to which no agent can judge evidently. Parsons finds some resources for blocking truth-value gaps in Husserl's idealization of the possibility of evident judgment (which proceeds by an interesting analogy with fulfillment by outer perception), and more in Brouwer's intuitionistic semantics. In closing, Parsons suggests that Brentano prefigures the move from deflationism about truth, which is only implicit in his work, to an epistemic conception.
"Husserl and the Linguistic Turn" grew out of a commentary on Michael Dummett's Origins of Analytical Philosophy. Parsons proposes to follow Dummett in considering the doctrinal relationship between Husserl's views and analytical philosophy, which Dummett characterizes as committed to attaining a "philosophical account of thought" through such an account of language. Dummett identifies the factor separating Husserl from the analytic tradition as his introduction of the noema, which Dummett takes to involve the generalization of the notion of meaning to all acts.
While Parsons' essay is "not at all" about philosophy of mathematics (as he notes in the Preface, p. ix), its themes are important for his "systematic" (i.e. non-historical) philosophy. In Mathematical Thought and its Objects Parsons develops a view of intuition on which the objects it delivers can be abstract (in the way required of "mathematical" objects), but which preserves the analogy between intuition and perception. For "guidance", Parsons appeals to Husserl's notion of "categorial" intuition, which can have as its objects collections, indeterminate totalities, numbers, and predicates. He follows Husserl in first considering how consciousness of abstract objects, e.g. colors, is "closely intertwined with perception" (p. 155). For Husserl, both universals like "Red" and universals like "Triangle" are given (or "constituted") in acts of connecting, relating, or generalizing, which count as intuition because they function to fulfill intentions of (other) acts. The "intention-fulfillment schema" is thus the basis for widening the notion of intuition as well as for generalizing the notion of meaning (cf. p. 145).
Returning to Dummett: Parsons holds that the divergence between Husserl and the analytic tradition is not as sharply marked by the introduction of the noema as by the "reduction" in terms of which the noema is explained. Parsons locates it specifically in the "Cartesian" assumption on which the reduction depends, namely that the meaning of acts can be adequately treated "without making any presuppositions about reference" (p. 200).
The last two of the essay's four sections consider whether the generalization of meaning to all acts in fact precludes the linguistic turn. Dummett contends that a priority of language over thought is ruled out by Husserl's extension of (noematic) sense to perception, "that mental act least obviously fitted to be expressed in words" (Origins, p. 27). For, Husserl's separation of the notion of meaning from "the senses of words . . . only underlines the lack of any substantial account of what it [meaning] is" (Origins, p. 117). The deepest objection to Husserl's view that Parsons finds in Dummett is that it is not clear how to understand the "veridicality" of a perception "as the truth of a judgment or proposition contained in the noematic sense", because "we do not know how the constituent meanings combine to constitute a state of affairs as their intentional object".
Parsons finds a conflict between Husserl's view of perception as more simply structured than judgment and his view that it involves the attribution of properties to objects. This difficulty has to do with "the relation of the noema of a perception to its expression" insofar as the relative simplicity of perception makes it a "nominal" rather than "propositional" act, so that its noematic sense would be expressed in language by a noun phrase rather than a sentence. (It's assumed here that in general, the noematic sense of acts is expressible in language.) Parsons argues, however, that a noun phrase such as "this white thing" is not apt to express the part of a perception's meaning (the involvement of whiteness) that it is supposed to render (pp. 207-8). He concludes that the problems with Husserl's view "concern not thought itself but how perception relates to thought". So they don't rule out the linguistic turn as Dummett understands it. But, in light of "the dependence of thought on perception", they suggest that full understanding of thought requires "other methods": if not Husserl's phenomenological method, then "perhaps an appropriation and analysis of the results of empirical psychology" (p. 213). The essay as a whole sustains a case that Husserl is of interest for the study of analytic philosophy as an "object of comparison", particularly because (unlike Frege) he could "see the issues surrounding 'psychologism' from both sides" (p. 194).
Readers not very familiar with Husserl (like myself) would have benefited from a fuller account of the problems with his view of perception. On Husserl's behalf, Parsons seeks not only to find a linguistic form to express perception's noematic sense but also to understand how perception of, e.g., a blue object can "ground" the judgment that it is blue. While the question of how perceptual experience relates to belief and judgment looms large in epistemology, I take it that for Husserl it is primarily an issue of "transcendental logic" specifically to explain how judgments arise from "pre-predicative" experience. Parsons finds in Husserl's Experience and Judgment an account of how the attribution of properties can be "implicit" in perceptual experience and "become explicit upon both singling out certain properties and, by a synthesis giving rise to a judgment, formulating judgments of the form 'S isp'". But he claims that Husserl's view "seems . . . bound to leave mysterious how the generality of the predicate arises" (p. 212). In the absence of an alternative to the Fregean understanding of predicates (as sentences with empty argument places), we must suppose that the contents of perception are already, even if only implicitly, propositionally structured. Parsons sees Husserl's analysis of perception in terms of moments as relevant to the difficulty, but it's not clear how it bears on the issue. On Husserl's analysis, the properties attributed in perception can be understood as particular property-instances (tropes). If this is supposed to account for perception's greater simplicity, then it indeed seems to leave Husserl no way to explain how the generality of the predicate arises. But while Parsons seems to think the doctrine of moments positively hinders the search for a linguistic expression of perception's noematic sense, he says only that it fails to solve -- not that it gives rise to -- the problem of how perception grounds judgment. Thus the source of the problem remains unclear.
"Some Remarks on Frege's Conception of Extension" considers Frege's comments on the concept of a set as an "aggregate" and how his view of extension developed after learning of Russell's paradox. The latter theme is pursued in "Frege's Correspondence". Parsons has long been concerned with how damaging the paradox is for Frege's project. But here he seems at least as interested in the resources for avoiding paradox afforded by the conception of a set as the extension of a predicate. Specifically, he considers whether this conception supports a priority of elements over the set containing them. (In §I of "What is the Iterative Conception of Set?", Parsons treats this priority as an abstract version of the relationship of constitution that holds between elements and sets on "genetic" or "constructive" accounts. Whether the latter conceptions of set thus coincide with a predicative understanding is important for Parsons' systematic philosophy.)
"Some Remarks" preceded writings in which Parsons raises this question with regard to other foundational writers. In particular, in "What is the Iterative Conception of Set?" He suggests that Cantor's notion of multiplicity bears an analogy to Frege's notion of concept in that both must be explained in terms of predication. Specifically, predication explains how "inconsistent" multiplicities, which do not make up sets, may nonetheless be given to us. The analogy extends to the point of withholding the status of "object" from inconsistent multiplicities. But while on Frege's view concepts are not objects, on Cantor's view a multiplicity may be a set (if it is consistent). According to Parsons, "the idea of the predicative nature of the concept . . . does not seem to motivate Cantor's particular principles as to what multiplicities are 'consistent'" (pp. 283-4). The suggestion that motivates them, namely that "the elements of an 'inconsistent multiplicity' cannot all exist together", leads back (as Parsons argues on pp. 285-6) to the view more typically associated with Cantor, that sets are constituted from or formed by their elements.
"Some Remarks" first considers Frege's treatment of views that identify number with a "set, multitude, or plurality" or attribute it to an "aggregate" of things. At issue are several "perhaps not very precise ordinary concepts" (p. 119) which on Frege's understanding correspond to part-whole relationships, rather than set membership as we now conceive it. Aggregates are not suited to be bearers of number because they are assumed to exist in space and time and because the decomposition of an aggregate into parts is not uniquely determined. The distance from an understanding of part-whole relationships to a conception of set (and from there to a theory of number) recurs as a theme in Parsons' treatment of Kant; see below.
It has been argued on the basis of Frege's criticisms of Cantor, Husserl, and Dedekind that he would reject as psychologistic any more general conception (than the mereological) of sets as constituted from arbitrary elements. Parsons does not pursue this issue. Instead, he considers whether Frege's view that an extension "simply has its being in the concept" could "give rise to a priority of the elements of an extension to the extension". This would apparently make the objects falling under a concept prior to the concept, which Frege would reject. But Parsons suggests that since Frege understands concepts as functions, he might adopt Russell's view that "a propositional function presupposes its arguments, that is, the elements of its range of significance, not the arguments of which it is true" (p. 121). An immediate difficulty facing this suggestion is that it would make the extension of a concept prior to the concept (since the extension is an object and would thus be included in the range of significance of any concept-expression). The "simplest way out", to reject extensions as objects, was in fact taken by Frege at the end of his life.
The exchange with Russell brought Frege to consider an idea that (Parsons argues) could be seen as a manner of prioritizing arguments over the function, namely, excluding a function's Wertverlauf from its own range of significance. This would hold specifically for first-level functions. In "Frege's Correspondence", Parsons observes that Frege assumed that in any theory developed along these lines, a Wertverlauf would be distinguished from a function and figure as a "second-class 'improper' object". The stratification of objects would induce stratification of the functions that take them as arguments. Because Frege "assumed that quantification over functions was still needed, the theory would have an additional complexity over and above that of modern formulations of the simple theory of types". Parsons concludes here that Frege "found the complexity of the hierarchy daunting" (p. 150). He observes that Frege rejects the stratified theory proposed by Russell (in a letter of August 8, 1902) because "Russell uses function symbols without their argument places and does not seem to have in mind the hierarchy of levels of functions that would be required" (p. 151).
In "Some Remarks", Parsons suggests a deeper reason why it was difficult for Frege to envisage a "full theory" that stratifies objects this way. If a function is not defined for certain arguments, then universal quantification over its argument place(s) will not be adequate to express generalizations about "absolutely every object", such as the truths of logic and mathematics. Such "absolute generality" would instead require "a form of quantification not analyzed by Frege's logical theory, perhaps . . . a 'systematic ambiguity' of the quantifier" (p. 122). That Frege would not have the resources to express absolute generality if he gave up the assumption that functions are defined for all objects was more fully argued by Parsons in "Frege's Theory of Number" (pp. 158-160).
In correspondence, Frege gives this approach more consideration than the one for which he rejects it in Appendix II to Grundgesetze. The latter consideration then disappears from his writing. Parsons conjectures that Frege abandons it because it assigns the same number to two concepts, under one of which one more object falls (namely its own extension) than the other (p. 149, n. 35).
Parsons shows that in writings after 1902 Frege concentrates on what can be achieved in "fundamental logic", from which he explicitly excludes the notion of extension or class, and so effectively gives up on the reduction of arithmetic to logic. (As is well known, at the end of his life Frege came to hold that the source of arithmetical knowledge was geometrical.) Parsons contrasts Frege's treatment of extensions, as instrumental for general logic and the foundations of arithmetic and algebra, with Cantor's interest in set theory for its own sake. He concludes that Cantor's "concentration on the sequence of cardinals and ordinals brought home to him how the totality of sets must burst the bounds of any overall grasp we might seek to have of it" (p. 129), leaving him better positioned than Frege to block the paradoxes. However, Parsons takes issue with William Tait's claim that Cantor's review of Grundlagen can "reasonably" be "read as spotting immediately what is wrong with Frege's conception", and that Frege "should have taken heed". Parsons grants that Cantor likely regarded Frege's assumption that every concept has an extension as a "fatal flaw in Frege's approach". But he cautions that while the flaw becomes apparent with a deep understanding of Cantor's thought, it is "not so easy to say" how "reckless Frege's assumption was in the context of the time", for there were not many "deep students of Cantor's" apart from Cantor himself (p. 135). This reminder about how much sophistication to expect is important, since it has "become philosophical folklore" (as two recent writers put it) that the danger inherent in Frege's handling of extensions was signaled by Cantor in a way that contemporary readers could be expected to understand.
It is basic to Kant's view that intuition, which is "singular" representation and relates "immediately" to its object, contributes essentially to knowledge. Parsons' main contribution to the understanding of Kant's arguments has been to show how the immediacy of intuition may be relevant to its role in mathematics. Parsons' influential proposal was to understand immediacy as "direct, phenomenological presence to the mind, as in perception" (p. 10). This view developed in opposition to Jaakko Hintikka (and E. W. Beth), for whom intuition's only role is to afford consideration of individual objects. Since modern quantificational logic fulfills this function, whether it eliminates a role for intuition depends on whether we understand intuition as essentially immediate or only singular.
Parsons preserves the sensible character of (our) intuition even in mathematical contexts by taking it to directly present formal or structural features of our sensibility. One way for them to manifest concretely is as permitting, or limiting, possible experience or activity. Parsons develops this view most fully with respect to arithmetic (where it is less plausible to expect a role for intuition than in geometry). Parsons observes that the existential presuppositions carried by arithmetical identities such as "7 + 5 = 12" are verified by constructing sequences of numeral tokens. In the sequence of operations by which these marks are produced, time supplies a model for the structure of the natural numbers. (Parsons is careful to note that arithmetic does not stand to time exactly as geometry does to space.) Intuitive justification, on this construal, involves two kinds of insight into our forms of sensibility. The first enables a concretely given particular to represent a structure that can also belong to other possible objects of experience. The second is insight into the possibility of iterating an operation. This account was already set out in "Kant's Philosophy of Arithmetic" (1969); the essays collected here extend it to geometry, relate it to other recent interpretations, and expand on Kant's view of arithmetic's relationship to logic. Parsons also explains that he now conceives "phenomenological presence" as "a significant part of what the immediacy of intuition amounts to", no longer as simply what "immediacy" means (p. 102).
Parsons appears to share the puzzlement he attributes to Bernard Bolzano (pp. 93-6) as to how intuitions produced as "constructions of" concepts can express the concepts. Parsons does not try to explain how intuition as Kant conceives it can express something as general as a structure. In systematic writing, he appeals instead to Husserl's conception, which includes acts that are "founded on" intuitions in Kant's narrower sense. Parsons seems to think intuition as Kant conceives it has a better claim to deliver insight into iterability. To explain how, on Kant's view, space is represented as infinite, Parsons emphasizes the "phenomenological fact" that what is in space is "given in one space, therefore with a 'horizon' of surrounding space" (p. 16). This permits the boundlessness of space to be "witnessed" by a "succession of intuitions relating to parts of space each beyond or outside its predecessor" (p. 17). Parsons draws an explicit analogy between this use of intuition and the construction of the natural numbers (p. 17), and in his systematic writing, he appeals to both the spatial ground in which figures are given and the repeatability of temporal processes to ground knowledge of the constructability of numeral tokens in formal language.
Parsons' account of intuition's contribution to geometry appears in his excellent survey, "The Transcendental Aesthetic". He holds that intuition represents individual figures and verifies their properties as well as representing a single, infinite space. Parsons remarks that while the first two roles are shown to belong to intuition by "'logical analysis'" of geometrical inference, the last is argued for in Kant's "Metaphysical Exposition" of space, which (unlike other arguments in the "Aesthetic") does not obviously presuppose any geometrical knowledge.
In a book appearing the same year (1992) as Parsons' article, Michael Friedman defended the view that the role of intuition is, broadly speaking, to compensate for deficiencies in the logic available to Kant. On Friedman's reading of the "Metaphysical Exposition", it is because space's infinite extent and divisibility cannot be expressed in this logic that they must be represented intuitively. Friedman understands the intuitive representation in question in terms of iterated constructions. This sets his view apart from Hintikka's, and entails that intuition's role cannot be to independently justify mathematical knowledge, because the argument to establish its role (in representing space) assumes such knowledge (of space's features).
Friedman subsequently ceased to hold that the role Kant gives intuition is one fulfilled by inference rules in modern formal logic. The shift reflects Friedman's recognition of "a clear role for phenomenological or perceptual factors" ("Synthetic History Reconsidered", 586), especially the representation of surrounding space, in the Euclidean constructions that exemplify intuition's use. For Kant specialists, the most valuable material in Parsons' "Postscript" (and so presumably, since the other contents were previously published, the entire volume) will likely be his comparison between Friedman's current view and his own. Apart from the greater weight that Parsons puts on phenomenological factors, whatever disagreement remains is, as he says, "somewhat difficult to locate" (p. 103). Friedman still maintains that intuition does not yield "direct perceptual or quasi-perceptual access" to the infinity of space ("Synthetic History Reconsidered", 593). Parsons now clarifies that the givenness of a "further horizon" shows space to be boundless only in the weak sense that it "always invites a further step in such operations as extending a line segment". He does not find in Kant the general claim that any such step can be indefinitely iterated. However, Kant is explicitly committed to the indefinite iterability of the particular operation of the laying out of a segment of constant length on a given line, which demonstrates the lack of a bound on distances (p. 104). According to Parsons, insight about space obtained in this way "operates in the practice of geometry" rather than offering independent justification of the sort Friedman denies (p. 106). This seems to be a retreat from the position of "Infinity and Kant's Conception of the Possibility of Experience" (1964), if not that of "The Transcendental Aesthetic". For in the earlier paper, Parsons maintained that Kant would not have satisfactorily explained our a priori knowledge of space's infinity unless "concrete knowledge of [intuition's] form" were prior to "the content of mathematics" (pp. 95-6). But another point of agreement with Friedman, that knowledge of intuition's form does not yield considerations which would single out Euclidean space (as the model for axiom systems), has been part of Parsons' view all along.
"Arithmetic and the Categories" begins by noting that Kant gives no "articulated account of mathematical objects" (p. 43). Kant is explicit that what is considered in mathematics need not exist, since in mathematics "there is no question of" existence (A719/B747). The "role of" existence is "played" by constructibility in pure intuition (p. 44), but the main difficulty with understanding mathematical objects as constructibilia is that Kant "must regard some objects of arithmetic and algebra as at a conceptual remove from the intuitions that found statements about them" (p. 48). Moreover, agreement with the formal conditions of sensibility does not suffice for even possible existence, because that also requires agreement with the understanding's forms. These forms, derived from logic, are conditions on objecthood (or a conception of object) not restricted to what can be experienced, even if the understanding's pure concepts have application and "sense" only in relation to sensibility. (Interestingly, the view that logic yields the most general notion of object seems to be as important a contribution of Kant's to Parsons' systematic work as Kant's treatment of intuition; see MTO §§2-3.)
Kant's inclusion of "quantity" as a heading in his tables of the understanding's forms, and his description of number as a "purely intellectual synthesis", suggest that the categories yield a conception of arithmetical objects. Such a derivation of the concept of number would let Kant admit Frege's point that the concept's application appears not to be restricted to spatiotemporal objects. But Parsons finds that the "pure" categories of quantity (that is, considered apart from their "schematization" in space and time) yield only a minimal conception of quantity, as "a whole of parts . . . thought of as one object". Given a "definite conception of what the parts are", this whole can be understood as a set (p. 53), thus instituting a basis for the notion of number. Moreover, discrete and continuous quantity can be distinguished in terms of whether the "multiplicity" of a quantity's parts is determined by that quantity's concept. But while Kant suggests that parts could be given as elements by means of a concept (that holds of them), he does not clearly explain how. Instead, he tends to assume that parts are determined by spatiotemporal division. So intellectual resources require intuitive supplementation very soon along the way to a set-theoretic theory of cardinal number.
Kant does not consistently maintain an intellectualist view of number, but suggests elsewhere that the concept of number itself has temporal content. Parsons does not seem to offer any new grounds for this view, except to note its consonance with transcendental idealism (p. 58 and p. 61). He suggests in closing that the "duality" that creates tension in Kant's view, between "abstract conceptualization" and intuition, also divides later views on foundations of arithmetic, "with logicism and set-theoretic realism emphasizing the former, and the different forms of constructivism emphasizing the latter". Parsons suggests, further, that the roles of intuition and concept can be adequately (or at least "defensibly") accounted for by applying the modern conception of an abstract structure (to the natural numbers) and distinguishing the development of arithmetic, as a "theory of what must be true in such a structure", from the actual construction of an instance of the structure (pp. 67-8). By exhibiting the continuity from Kant to classic debates of the early twentieth century and his own investigation of structuralism, Parsons shows how modern developments do not just give rise to new questions, but illuminate issues whose interest and importance is not localized to a formal setting. This is what I find most exciting about his work.
Essays by Parsons other than those in From Kant to Husserl are cited as they appear in Mathematics in Philosophy (Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1983).
Burge, Tyler. "Frege on Extensions of Concepts, From 1884 to 1903". The Philosophical Review 93 (1984): 3-34.
Dummett, Michael. Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1991.
Dummett, Michael. Origins of Analytical Philosophy. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1993.
Ebert, Philip, and Marcus Rossberg. "Cantor on Frege's Foundations of Arithmetic". History and Philosophy of Logic 30 (2009): 341-348.
Friedman, Michael. "Synthetic History Reconsidered". In Discourse on a New Method, eds. Michael Dickson and Mary Domski. Chicago and LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court, 2010. pp. 571-814.
Parsons, Charles. Mathematical Thought and its Objects. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
Tait, W. W. "Frege versus Cantor and Dedekind". In Early Analytic Philosophy, ed. by W. W. Tait. Chicago and LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court, 1997. Pp. 213-248.
 Namely "Infinity and Kant's Conception of the Possibility of Experience", "Kant's Philosophy of Arithmetic", and "Frege's Theory of Number".
 Parsons finds that Brentano's argument tells most strongly against the view that sentences designate propositionally structured objects (taken as the basis for involving such objects in their truth-conditions). He suggests on p. 183 that the similar argument found in Frege may likewise be "defensible" if we understand its upshot, that "the thought that p is true is just the same thought as p", as denying that the reference of the sentence "p" is the thought.
 In "Frege's Theory of Number" (p. 164), Parsons observed that Frege needs principles of set existence (in particular Basic Law V) only to introduce terms for numbers and prove what is now known as "Hume's Principle", from which the Peano axioms can then be derived in second-order logic. This insight was germinal for the neo-Fregean program.
 In §22 of Mathematical Thought and its Objects, Parsons considers whether any single or uniform "ontological conception" of set, i.e. account of what a set is, motivates "the priority of element to set that is the keystone for the accepted strategy of avoiding the paradoxes". Finding it clear that neither the predicative nor constructive conception fulfills this role, Parsons supposes there might be a more adequate notion of which they (and a distinct "pluralistic" conception) are just "crude forms" (§20).
 For instance by Tyler Burge in "Frege on Extensions of Concepts, From 1884 To 1903" (p. 19). In Ch. 5 of Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, Dummett appears to attribute this criticism to Frege and to endorse it. For discussion, see Tait, "Frege versus Cantor and Dedekind".
 Parsons argues that Frege does not have this alternative in mind in his 1906 discussion of Schoenflies's treatment of the paradoxes (pp. 123-4).
 "Frege versus Cantor and Dedekind", pp. 109-111.
 Ebert and Rossberg, p. 342.
 See p. 131 of Mathematics in Philosophy.
 It is important for Parsons that on Husserl's conception intuition not only can be "categorial", but also can be founded on acts of either perceiving or imagining. See §52 of Husserl's Sixth Logical Investigation and §29 of Mathematical Thought and its Objects.
 Mathematical Thought and its Objects, p. 173.
 See p. 96 of "Infinity and Kant's Conception" and p. 16 of "The Transcendental Aesthetic".
 Even to derive this, Parsons has to flesh out Kant's account. The categories of quantity are unity, plurality, and totality, which is "nothing but plurality considered as a unity" (B111). Parsons appeals to Kant's lectures on metaphysics to show that plurality can be understood as the compresence of distinguishable parts. Thus totality can be understood as a whole of parts thought of as one object.