Gilbert Simondon has fascinated an increasing number of Anglophone scholars, not only as an important influence on Gilles Deleuze, Bernard Stiegler or Speculative Realism, but also as a philosopher in his own right. Despite various efforts of Simondon enthusiasts online and offline, the translation of his works has proven to be a very slow process, and the English-speaking public is still waiting for a full translation of his Psychic and Collective Individuation (L'individuation psychique et collective). As a foretaste, however, Edinburgh University Press has published David Scott's book, which serves as an introduction and a guide, providing a chapter-by-chapter commentary on Simondon's important work. As Scott follows the structure of Simondon's work very closely, this book will be useful for a parallel reading with Psychic and Collective Individuation.
They key problem that Simondon tries to solve in that book is the segregation of units. Let us imagine that we look at a figure on a background. We will grasp this figure as a separate unit rather than as a part of an indistinguishable mixture of patterns. Simondon asks what the specific operations are that make a subject perceive an object as a distinguishable entity, a consistent and pre-given individuality. For him, this is a question of individuation. Individuation, in turn, is closely related to the problem of genesis in that a particular object comes to exist through a series of specific operations of individuation. This is what Simondon calls 'ontogenesis' and what he tries to conceptualize in his book.
To begin with, Simondon argues against the received ways of approaching individuation. He finds it problematic that an individual is the point of departure for thinking about individuation. The problem lies in the fact that if we start to think about individuation with an individual, then individuation is reduced to a mere re-presentation of a specific individual. Instead, if we think about the individual starting with individuation, we are forced to reformulate our received categories of knowledge and radically reconsider what exactly an individual is. That is why Simondon wants to 'know the individuation via individuation, rather than individuation beginning with the individual' (29, italics in the original). This way, he can grasp the unfolding of becoming of an individual rather than its substance; he can shift the ontological presumptions 'from being to becoming, from substance to individuation' (5).
As we can see, in the field of philosophy Simondon wishes to challenge substantialist metaphysics. He also contests hylomorphism. According to the latter schema of thought, the individual is born from a form encountering matter. The problem with this idea is that, as Scott explains, the principle of individuation is posited as anterior to individuation: 'if individuation, that is to say the becoming of the individual, is synonymous with the form encountering matter, then this puts the principle of individuation outside of the act of their being related to one another' (4-5). In this scheme, the problem for Simondon is that hylomorphism assumes an encounter between matter and form as 'two already unified and formed "substances"' (5). This paralyzes thinking in terms of relations, operations and interdependencies, which is crucial for Simondon. The problem with both substantialist metaphysics and hylomorphism is that they operate with fixed and stable terms that are posited as autonomous structures constituting our world. They leave out conditions of energy involved in matter taking a form. For Simondon, the energetic potential residing in matter is liberated, oriented or canalised in the formation of an individual. This orientation of energy happens either through random natural conditions or through a directed human work (cf. Garelli 2005: 12). The energetic potential of a system is key for Simondon in thinking about individuation. Hence he wishes to reformulate human sciences on the basis of a 'human energetics' (43). As Scott summarises,
the individual is only one element produced by individuation; the individual is neither the sole goal nor motivating impetus for individuation happening. One does not pass rapidly through stages of individuation to finally realize in the end the individual, perfect and self-contained and exhausting being. (5)
Rather, one is being constantly (re)formed in the never-ending process of individuation. Simondon's belief is that 'a living being exists as only always a becoming between individuations, not as a becoming after individuation' (33).
How does this relate to psychic and collective individuation? For Simondon, the individual neither comes into existence alone nor ever exists alone. The individual is always 'relative to the milieu associated with its existence' (7) and can never be defined in isolation. Simondon considers the collective as anterior to an individual. That is why he argues against setting the individual over and against the collective. Individuation is always simultaneously collective and psychic: humans are both social and psychological beings. This means that for Simondon there exists no reason to separate sociology from psychology. There only exists a global phenomenon of individuation (cf. Stiegler 2007).
Psychic and collective individuation incessantly and persistently creates being as it advances, maintaining in each created or individuated scope of being, hic et nunc, an operation of individuation. After all, an individual exists and is only capable of individuating as a result of the relations it establishes with others and that others establish with it (77).
While discussing psychic individuation, Simondon focuses on the question of how the sensations we receive through our sense organs become unified perception. He places affectivity and emotivity at the heart of the individual's individualization. 'It is not perception but affectivity which permits a true appreciation of how the relationship between the consciousness and the individual comes about' (66). Before individuation becomes a cognitive process it is an affective one. And it is affect that mediates between the individual and its milieu. Scott explains the relation between the psychic and collective individuation in Simondon in the following way:
The two individuations, psychic and collective, are reciprocally dependent upon one another. Together these individuations define the category of the "transindividual", which accounts for the psychosocial unity of interior individuation (psychic) and exterior individuation (collective). Transindividuality is the purest expression of relational being, which is fundamental to Simondon's ontology of ontogenesis. Instead of elements (particles or clouds of particles) as starting points, might we see each starting point only as a singularity, as only already a relation-to-another starting, which is then another relation-to, potentially, ad infinitum? Might we imagine that relations come first and not the extremities of these relationships? (42)
Transindividuality is a relation that is simultaneously and mutually constitutive of both the individual and the collective. This concept attempts to capture operational movement of a system in the process of individuation. Its starting point is relationality between entities and their energetic potentials. What Simondon posits is a 'general theory of operations' (135), a theory of permanent transformations that is extremely productive for thinking about our immediate worlds.
An introduction to a thinker as complex as Simondon is always welcome because it helps a newcomer to a primary text overcome its initial theoretical hurdles. Scott positions Simondon well in his intellectual and historical context, including a description of his philosophical trajectories. He examines important philosophical influences on Simondon (Pre-Socratic thought, medieval scholasticism, Spinoza, Nietzsche, Carl Jung, Merleau-Ponty), philosophers he disagrees with (Aristotle, Kant, Freud) and his influence on contemporary thinkers (Stiegler, Negri, Agamben, Balibar). This intellectual landscape drawn by Scott is valuable.
Although the volume is directed at students and scholars alike, it is a tough read because of both the theoretical material and the writing style. Admittedly, Simondon is an extremely challenging philosopher, but the book lacks sufficient clarity to serve as an introduction. At a number of moments the book presupposes familiarity with the issues discussed, which, in fact, the introduction should be making clear. The inaccessibility might be also partly due to Scott's conscious decision to focus only on philosophical trajectories and completely leave out other fields that Simondon draws on in his book: 'physics, biochemistry, physiology, embryology, sociology and psychology' (3). This, understandably, was due to space limitations. It would have been helpful, however, if the non-philosophical terms were at least briefly explained. Such an attempt to engage with scholars of other specialties would have made this introduction more interdisciplinary, hence truly in the spirit of Simondon and his work. Alternatively, a concise glossary of technical terms would have been of great help to the target readership. For newcomers looking for an accessible primer on Simondon, this volume is not the optimal first choice. That said, various excursus throughout the introduction are much more accessible and carry a great potential for triggering ideas. At the end of the book, Scott suggests possible topics for further research, which could also be very useful for advanced students looking for possible lines of convergence in their research.
Jacques Garelli, Préface, Gilbert Simondon, L'individuation à la lumière des notions de forme et d'information (Grenoble: Millon, 2005) 9-19.
Bernard Stiegler, 'Changer de modèle industriel', un entretien européen, Pas faux -- Le vrai et ses nuances, 2007.