2017.06.24

T. J. Mawson

God and the Meanings of Life: What God Could and Couldn't Do to Make Our Lives More Meaningful,

T. J. Mawson, God and the Meanings of Life: What God Could and Couldn't Do to Make Our Lives More Meaningful, Bloomsbury, 2016, 240pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474212540.

Reviewed by Craig G. Bartholomew, Redeemer University College


The last twenty-five years or so have witnessed a remarkable renaissance of interest among a minority of analytical philosophers in the question of the meaning of life, and this monograph provides a substantial contribution to that discussion. T. J. Mawson explains and affirms the legitimacy of the renaissance of interest in this question (Chapter 1), rightly insisting that the question cannot and should not be reduced to emotion and subjectivity, and helpfully positions his views throughout within the current debate. As the plural "Meanings" in the title indicates, a significant concern of Mawson's is to tease out and assess the variety of questions involved in the question of the meaning of life (Chapters 2-4).

Mawson argues for a version of the amalgam thesis, located within one of polyvalence (pluralism). The amalgam thesis views the question of life's meaning as a lengthy disjunctive question or as an amalgam of related yet distinct questions about existence, value, purpose, futility, worth, significance, and death, among many others. Overall there are two sets of questions one can discern in the amalgam thesis: cosmic questions and individualist or particular questions. The latter include questions like: "what purposes should order my life?"; "what gives value to my life? and "what makes my life worthwhile?". Mawson carefully distinguishes his amalgam, polyvalent thesis, in which at least some of the distinct meanings in an individual life are non-casually related to each other, from a grab-bag approach in which there are no connections between different types of meaning other than, perhaps, causal ones. Indeed, one of the most interesting aspects of Mawson's work is his reflection on how lists of different questions and answers -- or none -- about meaning develop, and how these may be assembled into clusters through three phases of ranking (Chapter 6). The second ranking assembles questions and (non) answers in clusters; the third assembles them according to depth. While amalgam polyvalence allows for there to be finally just one cluster, Mawson's view is that there are in fact several.

Mawson's wariness of a monistic or unified response to the meaning of life is foregrounded in his argument for polyvalence. At the level of connotation, Mawson argues that there are a variety of meanings to "meaning" and "life" in the question of the meaning of life. In actuality, one is asking several different questions simultaneously. At the level of denotation these different questions have differing answers. Throughout the book Mawson expresses what initially appear to be surprisingly radical conclusions such as that there are many different meanings of life (15), but, as he unpacks such statements, they often turn out to be less radical than they appear to be. Indeed, one of the great strengths of this book is that Mawson insists on carefully examining the many different dimensions that are involved in posing and answering a complex, multifaceted question like that of the meaning of life. There are the cosmic, metaphysical questions; there are the personal, individualistic ones; there is the question of meaning at different times in one's life; there is the question of shallow versus deep -- which Mawson defines as desirability for us as individuals (162) -- meaning; there is the question of the interrelationship of these different types, and so on.

It is impressive to see Mawson, as a theist, working hard to understand and to do justice to non-theistic approaches, such as those of Sartre (especially Chapter 8), Camus, Thomas Nagel, and Bernard Williams, for example. Overall, he distinguishes between pessimists for whom our lives can only be meaningful if there is no God, and optimists, by comparison, who argue that the existence of God helps, and is perhaps necessary, for our lives to be meaningful. Later in the book (Chapter 8) Mawson adds neutralists for whom the question of God's existence has no effect either way. Sartre is a good example of a pessimist view; for him our lives can only be meaningful if we alone create their meaning. A different example is that of Nagel who hopes we are not under God's authority, and argues that top-level absurdity does not equate to lack of meaning all the way down. At each stage in his argument, Mawson explores the implications for both optimist and pessimist schools of thought; asking -- in his words -- what God brings to the party and what he takes away from it (cf. the sub-title of the book). Mawson is at pains to discern the (partial) truth in diverse schools of thought. The epigraph for the book, which also recurs in the text, is a famous quote from Job, "The LORD giveth, the LORD taketh away", which Mawson uses to capture his view that there is truth on both sides of the debate, although he concludes that there is more truth on the optimist side, since God provides for more and deeper sorts of meaning and greater overall meaning. Mawson's major argument in this respect is that God provides life after death for us all -- he espouses universalism -- by giving us eternal life. However, he is clear that no one answer is the correct one to the question of the meaning of life and that all answers, however partially true, leave us dissatisfied. Indeed, one of his aims in this book is to argue that one can and should become satisfied with dissatisfaction.

In arriving at optimism, Mawson acknowledges that others' intuitions might lead them in a different direction. This conflict of intuitions is by no means unique to the question of the meaning of life; rather, it is how every issue ends up.

Mawson's work is detailed and dense, although peppered throughout with good examples and thought experiments. In a review of this nature one cannot attend closely to the careful trail of the argument as it snakes through the work. Mawson has worked long and hard on these issues and readers interested in this topic will need and want to examine his arguments in detail. Suffice it here to make some evaluative comments about the work.

The major contribution of this work is to push us to reflect on the many nuances involved in any attention to the question of the meaning of life. Mawson is right, in my view, to argue that this one question contains many different ones, and that we need to tease out these different ones before trying too quickly to put them back together. However, I do wonder if the resistance to any fully correct answer to the question -- the issue of monism -- and the argument that all answers produce a measure of dissatisfaction is not related to a tension in Mawson's work. I think here, in particular, of the question of human autonomy and of Mawson's argument that God had to strike a balance between the sort of autonomy proposed by Sartre and our finding a purpose in a larger scheme of things. Mawson says of autonomy in the Sartrean sense that it is "a sense of meaningfulness that in and of itself we rightly value." (123) This affirmation of Sartre's view, albeit modified, is an important plank in Mawson's argument since it allows him to argue that these two types of meaning are good; they cannot be amalgamated and thus monism is avoided.

Within Christian theism, which I know best, many would not agree that even a modified version of Sartrean autonomy is something to value. Within orthodox Christian thought, such autonomy is the problem, embodying as it does our rebellion against God. Rather than autonomy we should speak of responsible freedom or freedom within God-ordained limits, with the view that we live most fully and most meaningfully when we live according to the grain of God's creation and will.

A similar tension is found in Mawson's view that theism is an opiate for alienation in the Marxist, Sartrean sense. He notes that he does not use "opiate" in a pejorative sense but maintains that such theism does not remove our alienation in the Marxist, Sartrean sense. Even if God's contribution to our lives is overall a net gain, God nevertheless detracts from our lives in the modified Sartrean sense. "His existence, even if overall a blessing for all of us, is a mixed blessing for all of us and one that's mixed differently for some of us." (132)

The issue underlying both of these tensions is, in my view, Mawson's view of the human person. Marx and Sartre work with radically different views of the human person to that of theists. At a deep level these views are irreconcilable and hence their views of the meaning of life are too. Once we see this, some of Mawson's barriers towards a more monistic view are subverted and so too, I suggest, is the view that we can never answer the question of life's meaning correctly. A fascinating exercise in this respect would be to revisit the epigraph of Mawson's book from Job 1:21, and to explore what this pregnant verse means in the literary context of the book of Job as a whole, in comparison with how Mawson uses it.

Furthermore, God granting us eternal life is central to Mawson's optimism. Intriguingly, in the eschatology of the Gospel of John, in particular, eternal life, which is the life of the age to come, has already broken into the world in Christ so that in an anticipatory sense eternal life is already available to believers. In John 17:3 we find a deeply relational definition of eternal life, namely that it is to know God. Here, I suggest, we find important, true clues to the overarching meaning of life.

Mawson is rightly concerned with the practical implications of his philosophical work and near the end of his book we find the penetrating conclusion that "the truly wise try first and foremost not to lead meaningful lives, but to lead good ones." (171) In this sense, we are most likely to find meaning when we are not aiming at it.

This is an important contribution to the current debate and my hope is that it will be widely read and receive the detailed engagement it merits.