2017.05.30

William Lane Craig

God Over All: Divine Aseity and the Challenge of Platonism

William Lane Craig, God Over All: Divine Aseity and the Challenge of Platonism, Oxford University Press, 2016, 241pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198786887.

Reviewed by Graham Oppy, Monash University


This book can be understood as a detailed examination of the following pair of arguments:

1. If a sentence of the form 'a is F' is literally true, then there is an object that is denoted by 'a' whose existence plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the literal truth of that sentence. (Premise: Ontological Commitment for Terms)
2. There are literally true sentences of the form 'a is F' for which any object denoted by 'a' whose existence plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the literal truth of that sentence is an abstract object. (Premise: Terms Denoting Abstract Objects)
3. If some abstract objects exist, then some abstract objects exist necessarily, eternally, and a se. (Premise: Aseity of Putatively Paradigmatic Abstract Objects)
4. If classical theism is true, then God is the only object that exists necessarily, eternally, and a se. (Premise: Uniqueness of Divine Aseity)
5. (Therefore) Classical theism is false. (From 1-4)

6. If a sentence of the form '∃xFx' is literally true, then there are objects in the domain of the quantifier whose (collective) existence plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the literal truth of that sentence. (Premise: Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers)
7. There are literally true sentences of the form '∃xFx' for which any objects in the domain of the quantifier whose (collective) existence plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the literal truth of that sentence are abstract objects. (Premise: Quantification over Domains Containing Abstract Objects)
8. If some abstract objects exist, then some abstract objects exist necessarily, eternally, and a se. (Premise: Aseity of Putatively Paradigmatic Abstract Objects)
9. If classical theism is true, then God is the only object that exists necessarily, eternally, and a se. (Premise: Uniqueness of Divine Aseity)
10. (Therefore) Classical theism is false. (From 1-4)

Chapter 1 ('Introduction') sets out and explains key terminology that is used in the subsequent discussion; Chapter 3 ('The Challenge of Platonism') introduces the above arguments (albeit not quite in the form that I have given to them; the precise formulation and labelling of the premises is mine). Works that figure prominently in these parts of Craig's discussion include Leftow 2012, van Inwagen 2009, Hale 1987, Burgess and Rosen 1997, Quine 1948, and Balaguer 1998.

Chapter 2 ('God: The Sole Ultimate Reality') attempts to provide an extensive defence of Uniqueness of Divine Aseity. Craig insists that there are 'very strong reasons both biblically and theologically for standing with the historic Christian tradition in affirming that God is the sole ultimate reality, exists a se, and is the source of all things apart from himself' (43).

Chapter 4 ('Absolute Creation') and Chapter 5 ('Divine Conceptualism') examine what Craig takes to be the best prospects for theistic rejection of Aseity of Putatively Paradigmatic Abstract Objects. Key targets for discussion in this chapter are Morris and Menzel 1986, McCann 2012, Leftow 2012, and Welty 2006. Craig's considered view is that theists 'would be well-advised to look elsewhere' (71) -- 'need to take a good look at anti-realist alternatives to Platonism' (95) -- when deliberating about how to avoid the conclusion of the above arguments.

Chapter 6 ('Making Ontological Commitments (1)') examines the prospects for rejection of Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers; and Chapter 7 ('Making Ontological Commitments (2)') examines the prospects for rejection of Ontological Commitment for Terms. Foils for Craig's discussion in these chapters include van Inwagen 2009, Azzouni 2010, Sider 2011, Williamson 2013, Lewis 1991, Routley 1979, Båve 2009, and Lambert 2003. Craig's considered view is that Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers and Ontological Commitment for Terms are 'not only false, but . . . obviously false and wholly implausible' (143).

Chapter 8 ('Useful Fictions'), Chapter 9 ('Figuratively Speaking') and Chapter 10 ('Make-Believe') examine the prospects for rejection of Terms Denoting Abstract Objects and Quantification over Domains Containing Abstract Objects. Notable foci of attention in this chapter include Field 1980, Azzouni 2010, Yablo 2005, Walton 1990, Leng 2010, Potter 2004, and Maddy 2011. Craig notes that the lines between fictionalism, figuralism, and pretence theories are blurred (204); he concludes that fictionalism is 'coherent and even plausible' (165), figuralism is 'a viable alternative' (180), and pretence theory is 'tenable . . . and attractive' (205).

Chapter 11 ('God over All') provides a brief, concluding synopsis. Craig says that he favours a 'combinatorial approach' to abstract objects: a framework of neutral quantification, allowance for non-referring singular terms, deflationary theories of truth and reference, figuralist and pretence-theoretic accounts of numbers, properties, propositions, and possible worlds, and the availability of rhetorical and modifying devices that allow us to make metaphysically heavyweight claims when we need to do so ('there really are no uncreated abstract objects').

In his Preface to the work, Craig tells us that it is an expansion of his 2015 Cadbury Lectures, themselves a condensation of another book -- Craig 2017 -- that provides the most 'extensive in-depth discussion' of a topic that has 'preoccupied him for the past dozen years'. Craig 2011a, 2011b, 2012, 2014a, 2014b, 2015a, 2015b and 2016 are previous outputs from this same research project; many readers of this review will already be quite familiar with the central features of Craig's position by way of these other works. Since Craig and I have already engaged in some back and forth on this topic -- in our several contributions to Gould 2014 -- I propose to take up an issue that, in my view, have not been exhausted by those earlier exchanges.

One natural question to ask, in connection with Ontological Commitment for Terms and Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers, is what notion of literal truth is invoked in these claims. Suppose that the usual, or most basic, uses of 'a' and 'F' are figural, or involve pretence. If we further suppose that it is true that a is F, should we go on to insist that it is a literal truth that a is F? Certainly, we need not be supposing that there is any further metaphor or exaggeration that attends the claim that a is F. But that may seem insufficient to decide the question whether it is literally true that a is F.

Some philosophers think that Ontological Commitment for Terms and Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers are obviously true; other philosophers -- including Craig and Jody Azzouni -- think that Ontological Commitment for Terms and Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers are obviously false. One possible explanation for this very dramatic divergence in opinion is that there is difference in the interpretation that these two classes of philosophers put upon the expression 'literal truth'. Philosophers who suppose that Ontological Commitment for Terms and Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers are obviously true suppose that, if the usual, or most basic, uses of 'a' and 'F' are figural, or involve pretence, then it is not literally true that a is F even when it is true that a is F. But philosophers who suppose that Ontological Commitment for Terms and Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers are obviously false suppose that, if it is true that a is F, then it is literally true that a is F, so long as there is no metaphor or exaggeration that attends the claim that a is F, even if the usual or basic uses of 'a' and 'F' are themselves figural or involve pretence.

If this is right, then it seems that we can readily arrive at uncontentious formulations of criteria of ontological commitment:

1. If a sentence of the form 'a is F' is true, and 'a' and 'F' are used in their usual or basic senses, and there is no pretence nor anything figural involved in those usual or basic senses of 'a' and 'F', then there is an object that is denoted by 'a' whose existence plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the truth of that sentence. (Revised Ontological Commitment for Terms)
2. If a sentence of the form '∃xFx' is true, and the existential quantifier and 'F' are used in their usual or basic senses, and there is no pretence nor anything figural involved in those usual or basic senses of the existential quantifier and 'F', then there are objects in the domain of the quantifier whose (collective) existence plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the truth of that sentence. (Revised Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers)

Craig might insist that these formulations remain contentious. I have only space to examine one kind of worry that he addresses in his book. (I leave other kinds of worries as exercises for the reader.) Consider the sentence 'Russell is a philosopher'. Presentists who suppose that this sentence is true will do so only because they suppose that there is pretence involved in this use of the name 'Russell'. And presentists who suppose that this sentence is false will suppose that the sentence "Russell was a philosopher" is true without accepting anything that falls within the scope of Revised Ontological Commitment for Terms.

Of course, if we reformulate Ontological Commitment for Terms and Ontological Commitment for Quantifiers in this way, we must then make corresponding revisions in Terms Denoting Abstract Objects and Quantification over Domains Containing Abstract Objects in order to preserve the validity of the argument that is the central focus of attention:

3. There are true sentences of the form 'a is F' in which 'a' and 'F' are used in their usual or basic senses -- where no pretence nor anything figural is involved in those usual or basic senses of 'a' and 'F' -- and for which any object denoted by 'a' whose existence plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the truth of those sentences is an abstract object. (Revised Terms Denoting Abstract Objects)
4. There are true sentences of the form '∃xFx' in which the existential quantifier and 'F' are used in their usual or basic senses -- where no pretence nor anything figural is involved in those usual or basic senses of the existential quantifier and 'F' -- and for which any objects in the domain of the quantifier whose (collective) existence plays an ineliminable role in the explanation of the truth of that sentence are abstract objects. (Premise: Quantification over Domains Containing Abstract Objects)

As far as I can see, these changes have no new implications for the subsequent, substantive discussion of fictionalism, figuralism and pretence theories. But, if that's right, then it seems to me that animadversions against Quinean and neo-Quinean accounts of ontological commitment are something of a red herring in discussions of the implications of Platonism for divine aseity. (Perhaps it is worth noting that, while I motivated the revised principles by considering differing interpretations of 'literal truth', there is simply no mention of literal truth in the revised principles. Even if the proposed interpretations of 'literal truth' are wildly mistaken, that has no implications for the acceptability of the revised formulation of the main argument.)

Much of this book is very good. In particular, I think that chapters 4, 5, 8, 9, and 10 are very well done. As I've just indicated, I think that chapters 6 and 7 are arguably a bit off target. And -- though I don't have space to make a case for this here -- I think that Chapter 2 is relatively weak. In particular, I think that Craig repeatedly argues that the best interpretation to put on one text is that it entails that God is the only object that exists necessarily, eternally and a se by appealing to another text concerning which he simply assumes that it entails that that God is the only object that exists necessarily, eternally and a se. Certainly, there are many, many passages in which the Biblical authors and the Church Fathers affirm that God is the only causal object that exists necessarily, eternally and a se; but it is not clear to me that there are any such texts that definitively rule out the necessary, eternal and a se existence of abstract objects. (And there might be reason to predict that we are unlikely find any such texts. If there are necessary, eternal and a se abstract objects, then, as a matter of logic, it is impossible for anything to bring them into existence, or cause them to go out of existence, or to bring about changes in their intrinsic properties. But not even an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good, necessarily existing, necessarily eternal, necessarily a se being can be expected to do what is logically impossible. So how can the existence of necessary, eternal and a se abstract objects be any kind of threat to the majesty, or independence, or sovereignty of God?)

REFERENCES

Azzouni, J. (2010) Talking about Nothing: Numbers, Hallucinations, and Fictions Oxford University Press

Balaguer, M. (1998) Platonism and Anti-Platonism in Mathematics Oxford University Press

Båve, A. (2009) 'A Deflationary Theory of Reference' Synthese 169, 51-73

Burgess, J. and Rosen, G. (1997) A Subject with No Object: Strategies for Nominalistic Interpretation of Mathematics Clarendon

Craig, W. (2011a) 'A Nominalist Perspective on God and Abstract Objects' Philosophia Christi 13, 305-21

Craig, W. (2011b) 'Why are (some) Platonists so insouciant?' Philosophy 86, 213-29

Craig, W. (2012) 'God and Abstract Objects' in A. Padgett and J. Stump (eds.) The Blackwell Companion to Science and Christianity Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 441-52

Craig, W. (2014a) 'Peter van Inwagen, Substitutional Quantification, and Ontological Commitment' Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 55, 553-61

Craig, W. (2014b) 'Anti-Platonism' in Gould (ed.) (2014), 113-26

Craig, W. (2015a) 'Divine Aseity and Abstract Objects' in C. Ruloff (ed.) Christian Philosophy of Religion: Essays in Honor of Stephen T. Davis University of Notre Dame Press, 165-201

Craig, W. (2015b) 'God and Abstract Objects' Philosophia Christi 17, 269-76

Craig, W. (2016) 'God and the Platonic Host' in M. Wood and P. Williams (eds.) C. S. Lewis at Poet's Corner Eugene: Cascade Books, 201-16

Craig, W. (2017) God and Abstract Objects: The Coherence of Theism: Aseity Springer

Field, H. (1980) Science without Numbers: A Defence of Nominalism Princeton University Press

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McCann, H. (2012) Creation and the Sovereignty of God Indiana University Press

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Potter, M. (2004) Set Theory and its Philosophy: A Critical Introduction Oxford University Press

Quine, Q. (1948) 'On what there is' Review of Metaphysics 2, 21-38

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Sider, T. (2011) Writing the Book of the World Clarendon

Van Inwagen, P. (2009) 'Being, Existence, and Ontological Commitment' in D. Chalmers, D. Manley, and R. Wasserman (eds.) Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology Clarendon, 472-506

Walton, K. (1990) Mimesis as Make-Believe: On the Foundations of Representational Arts Harvard University Press

Welty, G. (2006) Theistic Conceptual Realism: The Case for Interpreting Abstract Objects as Divine Ideas University of Oxford D.Phil. thesis

Williamson, T. (2013) Modal Logic as Metaphysics Oxford University Press

Yablo, S. (2005) 'The Myth of the Seven' in M. Kalderon (ed.) Fictionalism in Metaphysics Clarendon, 88-115