This book provides a curiously uneven study of a pivotal set of themes in Heidegger's work and indeed in Heidegger reception. Some of the unevenness in its treatment is a consequence of the very real difficulty of navigating between the demands of providing exposition of Heidegger's text, while doing justice to the astonishing variety of ways in which it has been taken up. The ambition of the undertaking does credit to its writer, but it may be over-ambition to attempt to cram into fewer than 180 pages a discussion of this deeply contested domain. While the line of discussion is broadly well conceived, lucidly presented and well defended, it is likely that those criticised en route to its conclusions will be less than satisfied by the inevitable brevity of the treatment of their views. This is a book which would have been better, if it were longer. Even so, there is much to admire, and the following will delineate its method of procedure, its strengths, and its limitations, and, in passing, what seem to this reviewer anyway, to be the principal casualties of some self-imposed limit on the number of words to be committed to paper.
Mahon O'Brien makes clear in the opening pages the twin commitments of his discussion of a trajectory from resoluteness to releasement The commitment is to an ontological, rather than an existential reading of authenticity, and to a transversal reading of continuity in Heidegger's enquiries, rather than a stage by stage reading of texts, seeking to identify discontinuities. He handles well the various differences between those who situate a break after Being and Time, and those who situate it after Introduction to Metaphysics, or after the war, sometimes in the interests of delimiting the contagion of Heidegger's thought by his political adventurism. There is an interesting agreement between those who see Heidegger as having been a Nazi all along and those who see him as an inspiring thinker, all along, in their respective commitments to a single trajectory of thought.
O'Brien discusses Habermas's contention that Heidegger's retrospective clarifications are devised as political self-exculpation, and seeks to show that no such motivation is present, and that even if it were, there might all the same be a deep-seated continuity between the opening of Being and Time and the late papers from the sixties. O'Brien cites approvingly David Farrell Krell's contention that the opening eight sections of Being and Time serve as an introduction not to Being and Time as it is now known, but to the whole of Heidegger's trajectory of enquiry. While the latter claim is moot, it is clearly the case that this introduction does not in fact delineate the torso of the enquiry, as carried out in Being and Time. For that enquiry does not arrive at a turn from Dasein to Sein, from the interrogation of Dasein to an analysis of the history of the forgetting of being, nor yet at a turn from the Zeitlichkeit of Dasein, to the Temporalität des Seins. As has often been remarked, the re-thematisation of Mitsein as authentic generationality and historicality is incomplete and prevents the transition from taking place.
O’Brien’s first three chapters treat in turn the arrival of the notion of resoluteness (Entschlossenheit) in the pages of Being and Time, the manner in which the attendant theme of authenticity (Eigentlichkeit) has been taken up, by Habermas and Gadamer, by Safranski and Wolin, and the evolution of that analysis in Introduction to Metaphysics, for which the enabling and disenabling movements of being, and its withdrawal, are more to the fore.
There is a shift of tone at the beginning of the fourth chapter, which summarises the argument so far, and then offers a detailed reading of the essay on technology, and there is then a fifth chapter, which treats the Letter on Humanism and the Letter to Father Richardson, printed at the beginning of William J Richardson's pathbreaking: Heidegger: Through Phenomenology to Thought (1963). It also returns to consider the earlier essay on truth, while failing to point up the connection back to resoluteness, as the ontological-existential condition for the arrival of a conception of truth, in Being and Time. The chapter moves on to consider, again, rather swiftly, the dangers arising from failing to distinguish between notions of a turn, a transition, a shift and a change (Kehre, Übergang, Wendung, Wechsel). Here the lack of detailed discussion of Contributions to Philosophy (of Enowning) (GA 65) and of the two companion volumes, Besinnung (GA 66) and the History of Beyng (GA 69) is most marked. Readings of these would have rebalanced a discussion which runs more in terms of the subjectivising notions of turn and shift, to the elision of the eventualising notions of transition and change.
Against the overarching intent of the reading, the discussion in chapters two and five thus turns more into a questioning of what Heidegger might have meant, and how his commentators have responded to him, as opposed to a focus on what calls for thought. The tone of the Conclusion underlines the difficulty: here the authorial voice arrives again as umpire to resume and summarise, and the conclusion to these remarks will return to the problem this poses. Two of the principal targets of this analysis are Michael Zimmerman and Bret W. Davis, whose discussions of authenticity and voluntarism serve as a foil against which O'Brien identifies a non-anthropological, non-voluntaristic, cumulative reading of resolution as releasement. What for Davis is key, the arrival of the vocabulary of the will in the Rektoratsrede (1933), is for O'Brien of far less significance. O'Brien's reading culminates in an analysis of the Gestell, the enframing of thinking, in which thinking loses contact with what calls for thought. The diagnosis is that, whereas in Being and Time the forgetting of being (Seinsvergessenheit) calls for resoluteness in taking up again the task for thinking, in "The Question Concerning Technology" a deepening oblivion of being (Seinsverlassenheit) requires a more nuanced attentiveness to what has gone missing: the releasement which allows for a more strongly articulated role for being, in its absence, as a determinant of thinking.
The reading of "The Question Concerning Technology" in chapter four is the high point of the book, and could be thought to demonstrate what writing in the mode of releasement is like, by contrast to the writing of Being and Time, in the mode of resolution: they are two distinct modes of attunement in any questioning of truth. O'Brien does not explicitly draw this contrast, but the difference in the mode of handling Heidegger's text suggests a sensitivity to this shift of register. For the transition from resolution to releasement is not just a shift in terminology, or of ontological commitment: it is a shift in the manner in which the task of enquiry as thinking is to be understood.
In “The Question Concerning Technology”, human being itself is put in question by technology, and its transformative intensification. This is not simply a question of human beings somehow coming to recognise that there is a topic here to be enquired about, but of transformations of the human, which may lead to a deepening incapacity to respond to the forgetting and oblivion of being. There might then be a question about how it is possible for O'Brien to be so lucid about what for Heidegger remains deeply obscure, to be wrested, but only with the greatest difficulty, from the obfuscation of a language mired in anachronism and in metaphysical distortion. O'Brien points up how Heidegger's essay concludes with an intimation that Hölderlin's poetic word, from the opening of the hymn, Patmos: 'where the danger is, there grows also the saving power', is also Heidegger's last word on what is to come.
This then makes sense of the book's opening epigraph, also from Hölderlin, from the hymn, The Rhine: 'For as you began, so you will remain', which is juxtaposed to a citation from the opening pages of Contributions to Philosophy (of Enowning). The suspicion arises that a chapter discussing this text may have been cut from this published version of the analysis, for the event, Ereignis, here unfortunately translated as 'enowning', is a term cognate with the Eigentlichkeit, the authenticity, of both resolution and releasement. It is furthermore regrettable that no attempt is made to discuss, let alone explain the enormous impact on Heidegger's thinking, and its search for new registers of inscription, of his immersion in Hölderlin's text, from 1934 onwards, displacing even Nietzsche as a favoured source for encouragement with respect to the healing power of the German language. O'Brien thus provides a detailed reading of the essay on technology, but fails to locate it fully within the context of Heidegger's search for a new way of intervening in, and disrupting, philosophy as a classically constituted discipline and mode of enquiry. The call for thinking, by contrast to the task of conceptual construction, is one which resonates through all the discussions of and references to Hölderlin.
In discussions of other commentary, O'Brien focuses on the conceptual content, and thematic, or ontological commitments, rather than on register, stance and attunement, and of course in one respect this is entirely right and proper, since this study is still a study in philosophy. The line of the interpretation adopted here, however, requires that study to run up against the limits of philosophy as argumentation, and to listen for these other registers, to which Heidegger attends, in order to retrieve a potential for insight which has allegedly gone missing since Plato's dialogues imposed an emphasis on true doctrine, at the cost of meditating on the curiously tangled compositions of the self. This then constitutes an objection to O'Brien's discussion, which is pellucid on the role of the various accounts of a discontinuity in Heidegger's enquiries.
The virtues of his lucid discussions are many: he locates his discussion well in terms of the many secondary sources and commentaries in which the vexed questions of continuity and discontinuity, turns and returns, politic adventurism and political reversal have been canvassed. It makes comprehensible the transitions from an analysis of being, Sein and Dasein, to a focus on beyng (Sein,Seyn) and Ereignis, although an understanding of the shift of register between being and beyng is assumed rather than argued. It reveals a dynamic of enquiry across texts, starting with the incompleteness of what is opened up for discussion in Being and Time, and to which O'Brien shows Heidegger returning in various distinct registers in subsequent texts. It allows the catastrophism of Heidegger's reading in 1935-36 of the human as the monstrous, of the emergent thematics of nihilism, and of the intensifying of self-estrangement in a technical fix to ring true.
What O’Brien does not do is to tackle head on the problematic invocation, already in Being and Time, of an authentic temporality and historicality, in which a generation may affirm a collective destiny. This topic returns to inform the discussions of truth and logic, in the recently translated highly controversial volumes, GA 36/37 and GA 38, Being and Truth: Lectures from 1933-1934 (2001), and Logic as the Question of the Essence of Language: Lectures from 1934 (1998). One key question here, to be broached in connection to the iconic status of Hölderlin, is the legitimacy or illegitimacy of Heidegger's delimitation of a generation as those belonging to a German speaking community. In the context of assessing degrees of Nazism, the politics of this are further complicated by the indelible marking of the German language and its literature by the contribution of German Jews. Walter Benjamin would belong to Heidegger's imagined generation.
The role of the reaffirmations of Hölderlin's paganism in Heidegger's evolving thought requires more attention if connections are to be made to discussions of the decline, from east to west, of a Greek inception of thinking, with its echoes in Nietzsche, Spengler, and any number of current analyses of the demise of Europe, and of the end of the United States of America as global leader. A notion of authentic historicality, giving rise to a genuine grasp of history, in its resonance with Marx and Marxism, is one which is intensively discussed in the French reception of Heidegger, negatively by Jean-Francois Lyotard, Pierre Bourdieu and Emmanuel Faye, positively by Bernard Stiegler, Jean-Luc Nancy, and Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe. It is a misfortune that a certain transatlantic prejudice has prevented O'Brien from pursuing this angle of enquiry, for the French questioning of Heidegger is precisely on the topic of the shape of politics today.
Situated between continental and transatlantic readings of Heidegger, O'Brien seems not to be affected by the self-questioning of an age in which there is a genuine question, whether philosophy in any of its guises is still a living mode of enquiry, with a contribution to make to the developing destiny of human beings on this planet, or whether, like Morris dancing, it is an outdated remnant. It is true that in the first two chapters he attends closely to the intervention of Jürgen Habermas in the discussion of Heidegger's enquiries, providing reasons for caution with respect to Habermas's perhaps hasty conclusions concerning Heidegger's self-interpretations. It might have been worthwhile to consider further the backdrop against which Habermas's intervention takes place. For it is to be situated in between two reading strategies to both of which O'Brien, like Habermas, decisively objects.
The first strategy is Adorno's amalgamation into a single Jargon of Authenticity, of the divergent strands of enquiry pursued by Sartre, Marcel and Heidegger, neglecting the distinction, all important for O'Brien, between existential and ontological resonances in the notions of resolution, authenticity, and releasement. The second is the reading strategy of Ernst Tugendhat, who connects Heidegger's text back to that of Husserl, and patiently isolates the discussion of resoluteness in Being and Time from the subsequent analyses. This, at the time, had the virtue of neutralising the then raging controversy about reading the works of Nazi sympathisers, which has slightly less force now. Tugendhat went on to argue the merits of Husserl's conception of truth, as grounded in a theory of judgment, in contrast to what he sees as a destruction both of judgment and of truth in Heidegger's text.
This critique could have supplied an important clue for O'Brien. For Heidegger is precisely developing the discussion of resoluteness, of the event of being and of a releasement, into an attunement to that event, as a critique of the notion that a theory of judgment, as available to human cognition, can supply an adequate theory of truth. For Heidegger, truth is on the side of being, or beyng, and thus exceeds the compass of any theory of judgment focused on human reasoning. On this basis then Heidegger seeks to think the possibility and actuality of change, and of the conditions of judgment, as crisis turning points in which human existence itself is at stake.
In his final chapter, O'Brien shows his sense of the importance of Heidegger's repeated reflections on truth as alêtheia: disclosing as the unveiling of forgetting. However, he does not grasp the connections from the ontologising of truth, to a critique of grounding truth in judgment and in a conception of language focused on assertion. Again Habermas has much to offer here, because of his insistence on the communicative, informational and indeed technological workings of language, expanding its philosophical significance well beyond any Aristotelian, or Husserlian emphasis on predication, assertion and judgment. Habermas's strategy, in contrast to those of Adorno and Tugendhat, has the twin virtues of treating Heidegger's enquiries as a whole, separate from some misguided notion of a spirit of the age, in the amalgamation of Heidegger, Sartre and Marcel, and as precisely not stopping with Being and Time. It is also explicitly a strategy, abandoning the philosophical claim on an eternal truth.
It is worth staying for a while with this reading, for Habermas's emphasis on the public sphere, on information and communication, as providing sufficient defence against political misappropriation is a challenge to which sympathetic readers of Heidegger must respond. It is perhaps precisely Hannah Arendt and Herbert Marcuse, the recalcitrant students, to whom O'Brien helpfully refers, who provide a clue as to the value of Heidegger's intervention as a contribution to political thinking. Arendt and Marcuse appear to accept that historical change takes place at a level beyond the reach of reflection, within constituted communities of communicative competence, and beyond the reach of analysis of powers of judgment. The political unconscious is a network of affects to which Husserl's and even Habermas's rationalisms can find no access. To this network of affects Heidegger's analyses, misguided as they are, do provide access. Since O'Brien has not made thematic a discussion of generationality and authentic historicality, he cannot invoke this level of political reflection which does in part open up to Heidegger, but is closed off to Husserl, and is extraneous to Habermas's notions of communicative competence and of structural changes in the public sphere.
This text is still functioning within an academic discipline called philosophy, taking for granted established protocols of proof and performance, and, clearly, some operation of shared criteria and terms of reference is unavoidable. It would, however, be beneficial if the discussion of Heidegger on releasement might be released from such domesticating protocols, to open out the question, what remains of the classical virtues of scholarship, and close reading, of philosophical enquiry into the possibility of meaning and the formation of concepts, of predication and the formation of judgment. Indeed the very role and function of such philosophical enquiry within educational provision for a humanity to come are issues for Heidegger, already in 1919, in the Kriegsnotseminar, the seminar in the time of military exigency. The focus and persistence of Heidegger's questioning makes sense only against the context of the profound disruption of tradition and inheritance arriving in the wake of the abolition of the Second Reich, and the emergence of the Third. These instabilities eject Heidegger from the comfort zone of secure disciplinary demarcations, and any reading of him should take this into account. Once ontology, disclosing and releasement are given precedence over conviction, calling and resolution, it becomes extraordinarily difficult to legitimate any authority for the authorial voice, and thus, for Heidegger, historicality and temporality are more genuine candidates for the status of authenticity than any authorial voice. The clarity of O'Brien's analyses makes this problem all the more salient.