2017.09.16

Ingmar Persson

Inclusive Ethics: Extending Beneficence and Egalitarian Justice

Ingmar Persson, Inclusive Ethics: Extending Beneficence and Egalitarian Justice, Oxford University Press, 2017, 288 pp., $70.00 (hbk),

Reviewed by David Kaspar, St. John's University


This book offers a comprehensive moral theory and applies it to a wide variety of issues. Abortion, personal identity, speciesism, death, the repugnant conclusion, prioritarianism, the philosophy of life -- all these and other topics are covered. Persson's general moral theory is a distinctive justice-respecting consequentialism aptly captured by the name 'inclusive ethics'.. Clearly more is covered by his theory than most ethicists would allow, including merely possible conscious beings and maggots. Its two fundamental concepts are beneficence and justice. The foundations of his theory are apparently more fully treated in his previous book, From Morality to the End of Reason (Oxford University Press, 2013), to which he frequently refers. What is admirable is how effortlessly Persson systematically treats the applied topics in this book, often delving into scientific, psychological, and metaphysical matters to support his case. Among the philosophers whose work he most frequently engages are Parfit, McMahan, and Temkin.

 

What comes to the fore is Persson's revisionary bent. The ideal in ethics, we think, is to capture only what is true, whether it be common-sense or something outside of it. Persson does not hesitate to go outside common-sense morality, or to contest it. He here gives us the opportunity to think about doing something distinctively different in life that we should do, but don't think to do. By systematically laying the foundations of morality and applying them, Persson gives us a way to evaluate his proposed moral revisions. So, on the two points of systematicity and revisionism, this book is very strong. However, two questions raised by his book are, how sound is his system? and, what are the details of the revisions?

 

Persson's most outstanding proposal concerns the matter of welfare. After considering it, I'm inclined to agree with it. Ever since G.E. Moore took hedonists to task, consequentialists generally have been either ignoring what value or values to substitute for pleasure, or proposing substitutes that are quickly met with counterexamples. Persson divides welfare into two categories, well-being and autonomy. Well-being has to do with positive experiences, which includes sensual enjoyment, enjoyment of activities, and pleasure that something is the case (32). Autonomy has to do with getting what we want, whether or not we're aware of getting it. Ever since Nozick invented the Experience Machine, consequentialists have struggled to deal with the possibility that even our most pleasurable experiences might be deceptive. The result is that we see that what actually happens is important, not just our experiences.

 

However, the mere satisfaction of our preferences can't be what makes for a good life either. Take Parfit's example: say I talk to a stranger on a train about her projects, and wish her much success before departing. I really want her to succeed. If she succeeds it is a satisfaction of my preference. But we won't say this outcome makes my life go any better. However, Persson's insistence on the value of the satisfaction of our preferences, even if some of them occur outside our experience, or even outside our life span, is well placed. For it seems to be an ineliminable part of human psychology that we care about how things go after we perish. And the best account of welfare needs to reflect that. One clear value of placing matters of preference-satisfaction under autonomy is that it seemingly incorporates Mill's insight that choosing an act thereby confers value on it.

 

Persson's 'dual aspect' view of welfare has far-reaching implications. One such implication concerns abortion. If the intrinsic good of well-being is considered as something only subjects can experience, then only a late stage fetus is capable of experiencing an intrinsic bad. Only conscious beings can suffer. However, if a fetus has the potential for being deprived of such a good, then it can nonetheless be harmed, just as an adult human would be harmed by being robbed of his potential to taste food. With welfare comprising the good in Persson's system, and harming being wrong, Persson argues that it is wrong to abort a fetus, once formed. He states, 'as soon as there is something with a potential to have consciousness later on, there is something for which events can be extrinsically good or bad and, thus, something that can be benefited and harmed' (55). The result is a morally pro-life position. He states, 'I would say that it is in fact harder than many believe to justify abortion morally' (76) However, since, generally, 'the law should not be as demanding as morality' (Ibid.), a pro-choice legal position results. In one of his most intriguing proposals along inclusive lines, Persson argues that preventing the existence of possible fetuses is harmful! -- a claim which is so outside what we currently think, it's frankly hard to assess.

 

Justice makes up the other part of Persson's moral system. It is with justice that we see Persson wave his revisionary flag high. His justice theory is described as extreme egalitarianism, which is based on the claim (J): 'Justice requires that everyone be equally well off, unless there is something that makes it just that some are worse off than others, or some autonomously choose to be worse off'. According to Persson, '(J) is a formal principle which is hard to deny' (150). He defends extreme egalitarianism by what he calls a demolition defense, 'because it demolishes the grounds which are designed to make inequality just' (164).

 

The two offending grounds are rights and deserts, two spawns of common-sense morality. And how do they offend? Consider the great income disparities in the West. This is allowed to happen because we operate under liberal systems of government that protect property rights. So, if Jane becomes wealthy at work, government institutions protect her wealth because she has a 'right' to what she's earned, or because she 'deserves' it. Despite their being favored by common-sense morality, Persson attacks the concepts of right and desert. One way he does this is by emphasizing that no one is 'ultimately responsible' for whatever profits they reap. True, Jane is proximately responsible for the actions she takes to amass her wealth. But she is not ultimately responsible for her cheery disposition, her intelligence, her responsible behavior, her effectiveness, her exemplary people skills and her neat appearance. Society, her parents, and her genes are responsible for all that. We might applaud Jane. But where does that leave Bill? He's not ultimately responsible for his sullen disposition, his low intelligence, his irresponsible behavior, his ineffectiveness, his poor people skills, and his slovenliness. That's on society, his parents, and his genes.

 

Throughout Inclusive Ethics, Persson is aware that many of his claims are counterintuitive. The culprit, once more, is easy to identify: 'One difficulty with the principles of beneficence and justice advanced in this book is . . . that they appear counterintuitive in the face of common-sense morality' (228). In his comprehensive systematic approach, Persson does more than offer moral prescriptions. He offers counsel in what he calls the philosophy of life, or what the ancients called ethics. This is a strand of Persson's theory that is quite welcome. Even after the matters of right and wrong have been settled, we still need a way to put the moral life in the context of our lives, a detail most ethicists leave out. Part of what makes it especially important to discuss this is that, as Persson claims, 'our lives are radically beyond our control, a matter of good or bad luck' (249). So, it's best that we come to terms with that. It's also critical that we come to terms with the fact that there 'is little hope that humans in general will be converted to a doctrine of extreme egalitarianism' (227). Once we recognize these unfortunate strands of the human condition, we can extend our control over our lives through reason. We can, first, obtain information about the means of controlling the external world. And secondly, we can adjust our attitudes 'to make them conform to the world around us' (250).

 

What are we to make of Persson's book? His extreme egalitarianism appears more vulnerable than he thinks. Look to his treatment of beneficence to glean indications of this. The basis of Persson's account of beneficence is something about which he makes a strong knowledge claim. He states, 'the originally intrinsic desire for pleasure is "incorrigible" or immune to factual errors' (34). Strong stuff. But when it comes to the comparable foundational justice claim (J), Persson is apparently less confident. It merely 'is hard to deny' (150). I found it rather easy to deny. Treating everyone equally seems to be a hard-to-deny principle of justice. That everyone ought to be equally well off is something about which we should have much less assurance.

 

Part of what makes (J) appear eminently revisable is Persson's insistence that reductions of welfare, if autonomously based, don't offend against justice, but autonomous increases of welfare are somehow unjust. Is that really an autonomy worthy of its name? The disparity seems arbitrary. Moreover, there are justice principles that conflict with (J) of which we're more confident. For example, 'equal pay for equal work' seems to be an evident principle of justice. Consider Jane, once more, endowed as she is with all of the good qualities an employer seeks. Her colleague Suzie has exactly the same traits. They are both paid $15 an hour. Suzie decides to work eight hours a day, spending her spare time maximizing her well-being. Jane, in contrast, autonomously decides to work twelve hours a day. At the end of the week, Suzie grosses $600; Jane, $900. If we believe in equal pay for equal work, this is a just distribution. If we believe in extreme egalitarianism, this is an unjust distribution.

 

Persson nowhere discusses the equal pay principle. But if he rejects it, we can, with good reason, guess he'll do so on the ground that it stems from common-sense morality. Common-sense morality, in Persson's view, is behind our irrationality about morality. It's behind our not accepting his inclusive ethics. The way Persson handles common-sense morality constitutes his greatest vulnerability. Common-sense morality serves as the foil for most of his views, as it did for Sidgwick. But it's not 1907, the year of the last edition of The Methods of Ethics. Consideration of the period between then and now reveals a large epistemic hole in Persson's theory, especially at the foundations. Sidgwick held the utility principle to be supported by self-evident propositions. And in providing an epistemic appraisal of them and common-sense moral principles, he provided an apples-to-apples comparison. Most twentieth century consequentialists after Sidgwick have studiously avoided describing what term of epistemic appraisal fits their principles. Persson is in this tradition. Although he describes our knowledge that our pleasures are desirable as certain (28), we need to know what term applies to his moral principles. If he's going to describe disagreement with his principles as irrational, he should at least inform us what level of epistemic justification he thinks they have. Are they certain, evident, beyond reasonable doubt, or something weaker than that?

 

Consider what epistemic appraisal common-sense moral principles deserve. Of some of them, Persson states: 'We do have a batch of common intuitions about what is morally right and wrong in many situations, for example about it being morally wrong to kill, torture, rape and steal in most circumstances, and it being right in general to help those who are much more needy than ourselves' (236). The fact that these principles are evident to us, I hold, is best explained by their being self-evidently true. Such principles are not merely intuited, they are extensively reflected on and thoroughly backed by intuitionist epistemological theories. Intuitionism, the theory widely regarded as having the best claim to capture common-sense morality, has recently been defended and developed by Robert Audi, Michael Huemer, Russ Shafer-Landau, and others, including me. No comparable consequentialist epistemology I'm aware of that is similarly related to a consequential principle has been offered. Until one is offered, we only have the basis for a ?-to-apples comparison, given that intuitionists aren't shy about claiming certain common-sense principles are self-evident. Nonetheless, there's much we can do in the meantime. By extensive reflection on these intuitive principles, and by extensive reflection on Persson's principles, we can determine over time what we really morally think.1

 

Common-sense morality in Inclusive Ethics is Persson's construct. He claims it is a product of genes and society that we are hard-wired to believe, yet it features doctrines. One is the act-omission doctrine, 'the doctrine that there is a stronger reason against harming in such ways as by killing than against omitting to benefit by saving life' (88). It's curious that what we are hard-wired to believe features doctrines. Even if people could be convinced to believe the abstract act-omission doctrine, why can't it be because certain moral principles are self-evidently true? The same question can be asked of rights and deserts principles. What Persson also overlooks is that although the doxastic persistence of certain moral propositions by most people might be explained by our being hard-wired to believe them, that can hardly account for their intuitive persistence. If hard-wiring accounts for our believing common-sense morality, it's a quite ineffective mechanism. Most students, for example, believe that morality is subjective or relative to a given culture, despite all the supposed hard-wiring to the contrary. But what they really think is that rape is wrong and that keeping promises is required. People have shown they can give up long-held moral beliefs such as that homosexual sex is wrong, while continuing to think that infidelity is wrong.

 

This is a tightly argued and challenging book. It is deserving of our study and of our responses. The wide range of topics it covers and the systematic way they are covered qualify it as an achievement. And it challenges many of our moral beliefs. Persson is quite comfortable standing outside what people commonly believe about morality, which will provide the reader with a number of surprises. The comprehensive systematic approach is one I strongly favor. For although there are important results that can be gathered by a purely piecemeal approach, working comprehensively over a variety of topics is where we learn the most about a moral theory. I've pinpointed what I think is the greatest vulnerability of Inclusive Ethics, but I can't say with confidence how significant it is. Only subsequent discussion can determine that for certain.


1 Granted, Persson does raise an objection that can be directed against intuitionism (37), which intuitionists have not answered satisfactorily: how moral facts might relate to synthetic a priori truths.