2018.02.13

Jody Azzouni

Ontology Without Borders

Jody Azzouni, Ontology Without Borders, Oxford University Press, 2017, 320pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780190622558.

Reviewed by Daniel Z. Korman, University of California, Santa Barbara


Jody Azzouni’s book touches on a number of important themes in ontology and metaontology. Azzouni challenges the view that ontological commitments can be read off of what is quantified over in ordinary discourse or in our best theories. He criticizes Eli Hirsch’s and Amie Thomasson’s deflationary accounts of ontological debate, as well as Thomas Hofweber’s view that quantifiers are polysemous, having both a heavyweight and a lightweight sense. He challenges the use of indispensability arguments and Ockham’s razor in resolving ontological debates. And he develops a sparse ontology, in the spirit of John Hawthorne and Andrew Cortens (1995), on which there are no objects “in the world” — either macroscopic or microscopic — but only a distribution of features. Metaphysicians interested in these topics will want to have a look.

Azzouni’s main aim is to defend a thesis he calls object projectivism. The first half of the book is largely devoted to defending and exploring a preliminary thesis, quantifier neutralism, according to which quantifying over some things does not thereby ontologically commit one to those things. The second half is devoted to the articulation and defense of object projectivism itself. Ostensibly, the defense of object projectivism is intended as a contribution to an ongoing debate about the existence of material objects, and Azzouni does engage with the standard positions and arguments from that debate. But the discussion proceeds not in terms of objects but rather in terms of “ontological borders”, and not in terms of whether they exist, or even whether they’re fundamental, but in terms of whether they’re “worldly”. (I’m reminded of Steve Martin’s complaint: “it’s like those French have a different word for everything!”) In what follows, I do my best to make sense of object projectivism and Azzouni’s “master argument” for it.

Object projectivism is the thesis that ontological borders are projected and not worldly. To start: what does it mean for something to be worldly? The rough idea, I take it, is that there’s what there is, but then there’s what’s really out there (in italics), and what’s worldly is what’s really out there. I found it useful to understand worldliness in terms of what Sider (2011) calls “structure”: what’s worldly is what’s structural. Azzouni doesn’t himself put it this way, and often distances himself from Sider, but this may only be because he disagrees with Sider about how much structure there is.

All that is worldly, for Azzouni, is what he calls “the feature presentation”. Roughly put, the idea is that only properties and relations are worldly. But Azzouni wants to avoid commitment even to the worldliness of individual properties and relations, so he prefers to say that what’s worldly is a spread of feature. (Think ‘features’, but as a mass noun.) The feature presentation is the whole spread.

What isn’t worldly, as already indicated, are ontological borders. It was never clear to me what ontological borders are supposed to be. In places, Azzouni seemed to have in mind something like the truthmakers for claims about which objects exist and which objects are which, or (perhaps) that in virtue of which the contents of some region constitute an object with such and such persistence conditions. In others, he seems to have in mind something more like the places or times at which objects begin and end. It was, however, clear enough how he wants us to visualize ontological borders: as “metaphysical bright lines” (138) circumscribing those regions of spacetime that are occupied by objects.

It also wasn’t entirely clear to me whether what he calls ontological borders are the same thing as what he calls ontological boundaries, object borders, or object boundaries. I had the impression that he was using them all interchangeably, arbitrarily switching from one to the other. What gives me pause is that ‘ontological borders’ and ‘object boundaries’ have separate entries in the index. (The entries for ‘ontological boundaries’ and ‘object borders’, on the other hand, both point the reader to the entry for object boundaries.) In any case, I’ll use ‘borders’ in what follows to cover all of these, and hope I’m not missing some critical distinction.

Borders, according to Azzouni, are not worldly; they’re “projected”. In his own words:

all ‘this is here’ / ‘that is there too’ identifications (across space and time) on anything are not worldly but projections onto the world by us — by our (largely subpersonal) psychological mechanisms (sensory ones, for example) and by linguistic reification practices (135)

In saying that borders are “projections”, I think all he means is that we experience and conceptualize the world as containing certain borders, and that we talk as if there are such borders. This fits with his insistence that projection “adds nothing to the world” and doesn’t “modify” the world (xvii). That said, he elsewhere characterizes views on which our experiences and intuitions “determine” worldly objects and borders as “collapsing into object projectivism” (150), which makes it sound like he (as an object projectivist) thinks that worldly borders are where they are as a result of mental activity.

His “master argument” against worldly borders goes something like this:

(P1) If there are worldly borders, then there must be some worldly properties to serve as those borders

(P2) There are no such worldly properties

(C)   So, there are no worldly borders

In defense of what I am calling P1, Azzouni maintains that it makes no sense to suppose that there are worldly borders that aren’t identical to worldly properties. Azzouni doesn’t elaborate on why this is supposed to make no sense. Given some of what he says — for instance, his demand for an account of the “magical ontological flavor” that “makes these things (but not other conglomerations) objects” (139) — one might think he has in mind something like an argument from arbitrariness. If there are worldly borders corresponding to (say) turkeys but not to trout-turkeys, then, on pain of intolerable arbitrariness, there had better be some explanation of this in terms of the properties of turkeys and trout-turkeys.

If that were the worry, however, then mereological universalists — who don’t privilege some “conglomerations” over others — should be off the hook and free to deny P1. But Azzouni doesn’t let them off the hook, demanding, for each object the universalist countenances, some account of its borders in terms of its properties and relations. Or as he puts it, “What’s the metaphysical ‘special sauce’ that makes (any possible) ontological border mind-independent and real?” (144).

As for P2, Azzouni places the burden on the defender of worldly borders to provide some good reason for believing in worldly properties that serve as borders. He then considers two possible reasons they might offer for believing in worldly borders. It wasn’t clear why these reasons were supposed to target P2 specifically, although they,are reasons to reject the conclusion of the argument. Perhaps the idea is that a reason to reject the conclusion would have to amount to a reason to reject P2, since — as Azzouni sees it — rejecting P1 makes no sense.

One possible reason for believing in worldly borders is that certain of our optimal theories require us to postulate them, for instance, because they involve quantification over microscopic objects. On one way of developing this idea, the very fact that the theories quantify over objects forces us to accept the worldliness of those objects and their borders. Here, Azzouni insists that quantification isn’t ontologically committing, drawing on the quantifier neutralist view he defended in the first part of the book. On another way of developing it, the idea is that the worldliness of such objects and their borders is needed in order to explain the optimality of the theories that quantify over them. Here, Azzouni insists that we have been given no reason to think that their optimality couldn’t equally well be explained in terms of the feature presentation alone.

The other putative reason he addresses for believing in worldly borders is that we can see them: perceptual experiences give us reason to believe in macroscopic objects with certain borders. Here, he responds with an argument from anthropocentrism. We can easily imagine a species whose perceptual apparatus divides things up differently. When they encounter two people holding hands, they seem to see a single object composed of the two. When they encounter a car in a garage, they are innately disposed to see it as an incar (an object that cannot exist outside of a garage). This, in turn, is meant to undermine any justification we initially had for believing in worldly objects and their borders on the basis of perception.

How, though, are these imaginative exercises supposed to undermine perceptual justification? A variety of different answers have been advanced in the literature, but it is not entirely clear what Azzouni himself has in mind. At one point, he seems to suggest that, when one engages in these exercises, the experienced borders are revealed directly in introspection to be mere projections (152). Speaking for myself, I don’t experience any such introspective revelation when I engage in these imaginative exercises — though I will admit to experiencing a good deal of epistemic angst!

A bit later, Azzouni points to the fact that we experience two stitched-together pieces of fabric as a single object, but not two stitched-together people, and he suggests that this “asystematic variability in our experience of worldly ontological borders” reveals the “projective nature of object boundaries” (153). Again, it seems that he has in mind an arbitrariness argument: there are no differences in the properties of stitched fabric and stitched people that could account for a worldly border corresponding to the one but not the other, and this is supposed to convince us that there are worldly borders corresponding to neither.

Universalists will wonder why this is meant to convince us that worldly borders should be eliminated, as opposed to proliferated. After all, the problem of “asystematic variability” can just as well be addressed by taking both the stitched fabric and the stitched people to have worldly borders. Framed explicitly as a response to P2, the idea would be that experience gives us reason to think that some properties of stitched fabric serve as a worldly border, and subsequent philosophical reflection gives us reason to think that properties of stitched people do too.

My own view about what these examples show is that metaphysics is hard. With some effort, though, we can often see why a differential treatment of some cases isn’t as “asystematic” as it first appears. Carmichael’s (2015) distinction between lump-like and event-like objects, for instance, could help with the case at hand.

I do wonder why Azzouni even needs the arguments from anthropocentrism, and why he didn’t opt for a different strategy, one that fits nicely with his view that talk about what there is or what exists is ontologically neutral. He could have said that perceptual experience is likewise ontologically neutral. When I have an experience as of an apple, for instance, the content of the experience is that there is an apple, not that some applish borders are worldly. Accordingly, he could have said that perceptual experiences are entirely irrelevant to questions of ontology, not because they are somehow debunked by imagining counterfactual perceivers, but simply because they are not even about what is or isn’t worldly.

This brings me to a final point. It was never entirely clear to me whether Azzouni thinks that ordinary objects exist. I would have thought that the whole point of the first part of the book — the extended defense of the view that affirming the existence of Fs doesn’t ontologically commit one to Fs — was to pave the way for denying the worldliness of objects and their borders while at the same time affirming the existence of objects and the truth of ordinary utterances about them. And yet, when he finally gets to the defense of object projectivism, he studiously avoids saying anything at all about whether there are (or exist) any ordinary objects.

That said, the introduction to the book does contain some clues about where he stands on the matter. But it’s a mixed bag. He begins one paragraph with, “It’s tempting to say object projectivism denies the existence of objects altogether” (xvi). He doesn’t actually go on to tell us whether we are supposed to resist the temptation, but the phrasing at least suggests that we should, and that he doesn’t deny that objects exist. Elsewhere on the same page, however, he says of certain positions that they “assume there are objects (object boundaries are worldly).” The phrasing suggests that he himself is equating the view that there are objects with the view that borders are worldly; and since he clearly thinks no borders are worldly, this suggests that he thinks there are no objects. A couple pages later, he insists that “contours demarcating shoely areas of spacetime” don’t themselves have to be worldly in order for ‘shoes exist’ to be true (xvii), which seems to suggest that he isn’t denying that there are shoes. A few pages later, he says that object projectivists “deny spatiotemporal objects” (xxii), which perhaps means that he denies their existence, but then again perhaps this is just a denial of their worldliness.

There’s probably some way of reconciling all of these claims, especially in light of Azzouni’s view that ‘exists’ and ‘there is’ sometimes are, and other times aren’t, used to express ontological commitment (63). Still, it would have been helpful to see an explicit discussion of how the nonworldliness of borders bears on the question of whether there are (or exist) any ordinary objects — even if the answer is “it’s complicated”.

This was a challenging book. While I came away with a rough picture of what Azzouni was up to, I didn’t feel that I had a sufficient grip on the central notions to assess the plausibility of object projectivism or the master argument for it, or even to locate the view relative to more familiar positions in the literature on material objects. In fairness, Azzouni himself warns that “object projectivism can’t be seen if the position isn’t developed along with quantifier neutralism” (xxv) Perhaps the problem is that I didn’t spend enough time with the opening chapters of the book to fully absorb the import of quantifier neutralism.

Still, this is an ambitious attempt to develop a detailed version of a style of view that lots of metaphysicians have found both attractive and elusive, one on which we can (in some sense) stand by the things we casually take there to be without having to be (in some sense) metaphysically serious about them. Those who are in the market for such a view should have a close look to see if object projectivism is what they’ve been looking for.

REFERENCES

Carmichael, Chad (2015), ‘Toward a Commonsense Answer to the Special Composition Question’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 93: 475-490.

Hawthorne, John and Cortens, Andrew (1995), ‘Towards Ontological Nihilism’, Philosophical Studies 79: 143-165.

Sider, Theodore (2011), Writing the Book of the World (Oxford University Press).