2017.09.13

Kwok-Ying Lau

Phenomenology and Intercultural Understanding: Toward a New Cultural Flesh

Kwok-Ying Lau, Phenomenology and Intercultural Understanding: Toward a New Cultural Flesh, Springer, 2016, 256pp., $109.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319447629.

Reviewed by Eric S. Nelson, Hong Kong University of Science and Technology


This book, the fruition of twenty years of research and writing about phenomenology, carefully and insightfully traces the complex historical relations between phenomenology and non-Western thought over the last century. It also offers a critical diagnosis of the contemporary impediments to, and possibilities for, intercultural philosophy.

One key element of Lau's argumentation is his sustained confrontation of the paradoxical relationship between phenomenology and non-Western and Asian philosophies with an original and provocative approach that is attentive and responsive to our intercultural embodiment and flesh. In particular, Lau's intercultural reinterpretation of the phenomenological notion of flesh resituates the discourse of intercultural philosophy that is dominated by the more typical discussion of intercultural communication and understanding that characteristically occurs without reference to their fleshy and worldly embodiment.

Lau provides a thoughtful response to the ambiguous and paradoxical relationship classical phenomenology has had with non-Western cultures and philosophies. He shows both how phenomenological philosophy frequently supported a Eurocentric understanding of philosophy and history (although there are counter-examples such as Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Jan Patočka, among others), and how it nonetheless provided an early and ongoing spur for intercultural interpretation and thinking.

Lau adopts a distinction between "open" and "closed" elements of a form of thought from Lao Sze-Kwang (勞思光, 1927-2012), a significant figure in twentieth-century Chinese philosophy, whose importance for intercultural philosophy is unfolded in Chapter 8. Lau traces the openness and closedness of phenomenology from its classical to its contemporary representatives. He interrogates the closed and isolated character of the Eurocentric conception of philosophy, spirit, and history that powerfully shapes the discourse of phenomenology from its origins in Husserl's interpretation of philosophy as a pure and objective "thêoria," associated with decisive moments in the developmental history of Western spirit, to a number of its contemporary proponents. This closure of phenomenology as a philosophy limited by its historical conditions and presuppositions is contrasted with and undone by the openness of phenomenological methods that call for and demand attentively and responsively encountering the phenomena themselves. While the former presuppositions have blocked and short-circuited intercultural dialogue and interpretation, the latter tendencies have disclosed pathways for its flourishing practice.

How then has phenomenology had a double role in relation to possibilities for intercultural thinking? On the one hand, a number of phenomenology's paradigmatic thinkers (most notably, Husserl and Heidegger) have explicitly identified philosophy with a uniquely and exclusively Greco-European transmission. The history of philosophy is a European history of the universal and infinite for Husserl and of the Occidental history of the concealment-unconcealement of being for Heidegger.

Both the cosmopolitan humanist Husserl and the anti-humanist and anti-globalist Heidegger reductively categorized non-Western forms of thought as essentially unphilosophical and non-conceptual forms of expression. Husserl considered Indian and Chinese philosophy to be merely mytho-poetic and practical, in contrast to the disinterested objectivity of pure theoretical inquiry, and Heidegger could at best appreciate Chinese and East Asian Daoism and Zen Buddhism as forms of "poetic thinking." Despite the moments of genuine engagement and encounter with Buddhism in Husserl (pp. 56-64) and Daoism and Zen Buddhism in Heidegger (pp. 37-40) that Lau astutely analyzes, the "Asiatic" and "Orient" are primarily interpreted as the other of the Occidental, an incomprehensible alterity and exteriority. In both Husserl and Heidegger, notwithstanding their differences about what is essential to their construction of an autonomous and isolated Western tradition, the result is a challenging call for the West to rediscover and recover its own genuine origins: whether it is its telos toward humanism and science (Husserl) or transformative encounter with the Greek origins of philosophy in the wonder of the question of being (Heidegger).

The exteriority of the other is revealed in a number of decisive ways in Husserl and Heidegger. Husserl can dismissively refer to Chinese and Indians as well as mention so-called "gypsies" wandering around geographical Europe without belonging to spiritual Europe.[1] Husserl's references to China typically operate in a number of different works as a symbol for what is completely alien and incomprehensible to the European world. For instance, in his posthumously published notes on the constitution of the lifeworld (Lebenswelt) through homeworld and alienworld, Husserl repeatedly returned to the Chinese as an exemplar of radical foreignness and incomprehensibility.[2]

Heidegger openly engaged with Daoist and Buddhist thinkers and sources throughout his career. Nonetheless, we find a series of hesitations about whether such encounters can be decisive and even possible, as Heidegger set the Occidental and Oriental, the morning and evening lands, into opposition, projected the encounter between East and West into a future that can only be anticipated and never enacted. He also reemphasized the necessity -- from his first formulation of the "first and other beginning" (der erste und der andere Anfang) in the early 1930s through his Spiegel Interview in 1966 -- of an Occidental encounter and confrontation with its own origins in order to initiate a new or other beginning. Or, to mention another revealing case, even while Emmanuel Levinas critiqued the priority of the self and the home in previous Husserlian and Heideggerian phenomenology for the sake of the other person and the neighbor, and opened up the differences and tensions between the ontological (Athens) and the ethical (Jerusalem) in interrogating the reign of identity and totality in Western philosophy, he could at points dismiss non-Western thinking as mere dancing, pagan idolatry, and faddish exoticism.[3]

These examples--and there are more--indicate how historical phenomenological discourses have been non-accidentally or systematically closed toward non-Western philosophical transmissions and sources in a number of fundamental ways. The sources of this closure can be identified with the definition of philosophy itself, its association with a certain conception of Western spirit and culture, and a metanarrative of its developmental history of progress (Husserl) or pathology (Heidegger) extending from the ancient Greeks to the modern West. This configuration of ideas is itself a modern one, unknown to ancient Greeks or even early modern Western philosophy. Lau's critical engagement with the Eurocentrism of phenomenology is apt and efficacious.

Lau rightly does not conclude with this negative assessment. There is also "the other hand." Since its beginnings phenomenology has been a crucial source for the encounter and dialogue between Western and non-Western philosophy. As Lau examines in chapter 4, Husserl himself saw the possibility of transcendental philosophy outside the West in his initial reflections on the Buddha, a thematic that was more complexly developed -- after Husserl quickly abandoned this possibility and increasingly identified the universal and the infinite solely with "Europe" -- by his students starting with his assistant Eugen Fink.

Phenomenology has been -- often notably through Asian scholars who studied with Husserl, Heidegger, and later phenomenologists in Europe -- at the forefront of encouraging encounters and stimulating dialogues between Western and non-Western philosophy. Merleau-Ponty, despite the perhaps lingering Hegelian concept of unity expressed in his introduction to a collection of sources of world philosophy, encouraged a more intercultural conception and practice of philosophy in "Everywhere and Nowhere," and further, as Lau argues, through his later explication of the inherent multiplicity, reversibility, and crisscrossing traversability of the flesh of the world.[4] Lau examines Merleau-Ponty's multi-dimensional chiasmic flesh in its in-betweenness and inter-corporeity and provides a suggestive (and less intellectualistic, static, and hierarchical) model for reflecting on processes of intercultural understanding and misunderstanding. Furthermore, Lau considers the intercultural import of the works of other phenomenologists and related philosophers whose works have been relatively neglected in comparative philosophy.

A particularly significant and striking contribution are the chapters in which Lau traces how Patočka's phenomenology developed (albeit imperfectly) and is an inspiration for a non-Eurocentric and appropriately intercultural conception and practice of philosophy in its atypical engagement with the typically Eurocentric topic of "Europe." Patočka depicted the "care of the soul" as the spiritual foundation of Europe and understood the development of the care of the soul as a uniquely European humanistic achievement (pp. 93-97). As with Husserl to some extent, whose limited conception of humanity in the Crisis he critiques (pp. 87-93), a central concept of Patočka's phenomenology is identified with an underlying thematic of Western civilization that serves as basis for a critique of the present (in this case, the Soviet domination of Eastern Europe). Lau undoes the exclusivity of Patočka's claim by tracing how the care of the soul, or the particular sense of self of a given cultural-historical milieu, is a human concern across diverse contexts. Accordingly, in the Chinese context, one can find a deep concern with the dignity and moral worth of the individual self in the Confucian intellectual lineage and particularly in the account of the "four sprouts" (siduan 四端), which call for appropriate cultivation and care to be developed into ethical dispositions, in Mencius孟子 (pp. 98-103). Lau elucidates the phenomenological implications of the sprouts and moral embodiment in the Mencius.

There has been a rich and varied literature unfolding the phenomenological dimensions of South and East Asian philosophies and how Western phenomenological inquiry can learn from and be reoriented by Buddhist, Daoist, and other phenomenologies communicated in non-Western sources and discourses. A powerful example of this potential is evident in Lau's third chapter that provocatively interprets the Daodejing (道德經) of Laozi (老子) in dialogue with Merleau-Ponty. This chapter unfolds the phenomenology of vacuity and quietude, tenderness and weakness, explicating the dao (道) in the Daodejing as inchoative nature in relation to Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of nature, (pp. 42-52).

Lau raises a number of claims and issues that warrant further questioning and clarification.

(1) One objection to the project of intercultural philosophy is that a horizon of ethnocentric presuppositions, so to speak an ethnocentric a priori, is inevitable and cannot be overcome. Lau's work does not deny that all thinking, including intercultural philosophy, has its contexts and assumptions. His argument is that the project of intercultural philosophy serves as an orientating idea that allows these conditions and presuppositions to be discussed, questioned, and potentially transformed. The word "intercultural" indicates the occurrence of a dynamic process of embodied communication that transforms the participants involved. It should not be understood as the essentialism of vulgar versions of multiculturalism, the correlate of nationalism, which identifies each people and culture with an unchanging essence and identity that cannot be transformed or appropriated by others. The issue of cultural appropriation-misappropriation-de-appropriation is complex insofar as it encompasses asymmetrical relations of power and their sedimentations that continue to block and undermine intercultural understanding.

Lau's response to this impasse is to articulate how the intercultural is precisely, adopting Lao Sze-Kwang's language, an open element that can contest and transform closed elements. One can practice what he describes as a "double epoché" in relation to the linguistic and philosophical medium which one employs and presupposes (p. 23). Lau can expand the role of the epoché, as he interprets it as operating as an open and orientative element in Husserl's philosophy (pp. 146-150), just as he modifies Derrida's practice of deconstruction with his own practice of an intercultural "para-deconstruction," in response to a situation of the radical plurality of cultures (pp. 29-31).

(2) These questions lead us to a further set of issues and another objection. Can one decisively separate the openness of the phenomenological method from the closedness of classical phenomenology's undeniably Eurocentric and ethnocentric moments that continue to inform contemporary accounts of and approaches to phenomenology? What if phenomenological philosophy is more tightly interwoven with its cultural-historical presuppositions of the superiority of the West such that phenomenology's open elements are undone by its closed elements rather than the opposite? This question indicates that there is a contest for the "soul" of phenomenology and its care, to adopt Patočka's language, and potential limits to how far classical phenomenology can be taken in an intercultural direction and requires an explicitly intercultural conception and practice of phenomenology.

(3) A third problematic is the contrast between understanding philosophy as an art and way of life in contrast to the primacy of theory. Adopting another distinction from Lao Sze-Kwang between "orientative" and "theoretical" philosophizing, Chinese philosophy can be understood as life-orienting and modern Western philosophy as cognitive and theoretical (p. 125). Of course, on the one hand, pre-modern Western philosophy (including most of classical Greek, Hellenistic, and Roman philosophy) understood philosophy as an art of living. This motivation has never been entirely absent even in modernity, despite the preeminence of method and theory, as movements such as life-philosophy and existentialism reemphasized questions of life and how to live. On the other hand, this contrast is not without validity. Aristotle and the subsequent Western tradition have often accentuated how objective dispassionate theory expresses the highest form of life. This interpretation informs phenomenology through Husserl's conception of philosophy as theory. Following the dominant model of classical German philosophy, Husserl placed the emphasis on the primacy of theory and how this priority distinguished European from non-European forms of thinking. Husserl portrays the theoretical attitude as the freest and highest form of life in The Crisis of the European Sciences. Theory is a form of practice that can transform the lifeworld through its independence from practical concerns, an independence that he contends exists only in Europe.

(4) The priority of theory is interlinked with the Eurocentrism of modern Western philosophy. Nonetheless, it is not its sufficient condition as some counter-examples indicate. In particular, Leibniz has a deeply theoretical oriented philosophy, prioritizing its mathematical and logical form, and does not exclude non-Western philosophies from the realm of philosophy. Not only did Leibniz allow for the possibility of philosophy in -- for instance -- the Chinese world, which he actively engaged in interpreting. In this situation, at the beginnings of the Enlightenment across Europe, the standing of theory does not necessarily lead to the exclusion of different forms of philosophy. One reason for this might well be not only Leibniz's hermeneutic openness to other cultures but also his analysis of the gradation between perception, imagination, and cognition. The pictorial image and the purely cognitive concept, dependent practical concern and autonomous objective theorizing, are not the radical opposites for Leibniz that they will be in subsequent philosophical discourse. There is continuity in the transformations between them such that the image is already proto-conceptual and the conceptual can be expressed and grasped through images and symbols as mathematics reveals in a highly sophisticated form. Leibniz could recognize a logic and mathematics in the unfolding of the Yijing(易經, Book of Changes) unlike later thinkers (e.g., Hegel, who dismissed it as non-conceptual pictorial thinking).[5] The idea of theory aims at the universal, which it fails to achieve in Eurocentric conceptions of theory and humanity that undermine its very pretention to universality. Hegel's philosophy of ethical life and Husserl's phenomenology of the lifeworld, in which they situate the theoretical and scientific enterprise, might indicate alternative paths. Nonetheless, these elucidations of the concrete bonds of practical life did not lead either thinker to recognize non-Western philosophies as philosophical. In contrast to Hegel and Husserl who identify theory and spirit exclusively with the West (pp. 55-56), Leibniz's writings on China indicate how the analysis of theory and its practical mediation need not take this route.

Lau's book is an original and thoughtful study for our contemporary understanding and practice of phenomenology, both as an historical intellectual movement and as an open orientative method; it discusses the contemporary hybrid and impure hermeneutical situation and the possibilities of intercultural philosophy and interpretation. It not only anticipates or speaks abstractly about such possibilities. Lau's work itself enacts intercultural communication, bringing into conversation a range of diverse sources and authors from Chinese and Continental European thought: Laozi, Mengzi, Lao Sze-Kwang, Zhuangzi (莊子), Derrida, Foucault, Hegel, Husserl, Lévinas, Lévi-Strauss, Merleau-Ponty, and Patočka.

This is a refreshing work given the dominant monotonous Eurocentrism of academic philosophy that cannot perceive or admit philosophical inquiry outside of the Western tradition or, even more narrowly, of a limited subsection of it such as contemporary Anglophone thought. There are, however, encouraging new developments and arguably a growing "intercultural turn" occurring in contemporary Western philosophy.

Lau lucidly articulates a phenomenological interpretation of intercultural philosophy, tracing how the phenomenological method has contributed to the flourishing of intercultural philosophy and indicates further paths to pursue. He deftly examines the Eurocentric moments in the phenomenological tradition in relation to its possibilities for intercultural philosophy by unfolding a phenomenological approach to intercultural understanding through its continuing intercultural embodiment and flesh.


[1] Husserl, Edmund. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy, tr. David Carr (Northwestern University Press, 1970), 273.

[2] See, for instance, Husserl, Edmund. Die Lebenswelt: Auslegungen der vorgegebenen Welt und ihrer Konstitution (Springer-Verlag, 2008), 157-163, 169, 171, 341-342, 524, 538, 549, 691.

[3] Also compare such examples and the problematic of Eurocentrism in Nelson, Eric S. Chinese and Buddhist Philosophy in Early Twentieth-Century German Thought (Bloomsbury 2017). There is arguably a growing "intercultural turn" occurring in contemporary Western philosophy as other recent works indicate: Flanagan, Owen. The Geography of Morals: Varieties of Moral Possibility (Oxford University Press, 2016) and Van Norden, Bryan W. Taking Back Philosophy: A Multicultural Manifesto (Columbia University Press, 2017).

[4] Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. "Partout et nulle part", in Signes (Gallimard, 1960); "Everywhere and Nowhere", in Signs, tr. R. C. McCleary (Northwestern University Press, 1964).

[5] See the discussion of the changing attitude in Western philosophy toward the Yijing from Leibniz to Hegel in Nelson, Eric S. "The Yijing and Philosophy: From Leibniz to Derrida." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 38.3 (2011): 377-396.