2017.05.20

Steven M. Cahn

Religion Within Reason

Steven M. Cahn, Religion Within Reason, Columbia University Press, 2017, 105pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231181617.

Reviewed by William J. Wainwright, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


Steven Cahn's professed goal is "to provide an acceptable . . . and provocative overview of the sort of challenges philosophy presents to any version of supernatural belief, while also exploring the possibility of religion within a naturalistic framework." He approaches his subject as an atheist who nonetheless finds much to "admire in a religious life as long as its beliefs and practices do not violate the methods and results of scientific inquiry" (p. ix). Chapters 1-15 and 17 are principally devoted to debunking theism. The remainder (Chapters 16, 18, and 19) articulate Cahn's atheistic but religious alternative.

To whom is Cahn's book addressed? Not to philosophically sophisticated theists since they are already familiar with the sorts of anti-theistic arguments that Cahn advances and remain unconvinced by them. For example, Cahn dismisses ontological arguments for the existence of God on the grounds that existence isn't a predicate (p. 3) without pointing out that the claim that existence isn't a predicate is philosophically contentious or that even if existence is not a predicate, necessary existence arguably is a predicate, which is all that the argument requires.[1]

To whom, then, is Cahn's book addressed? To convinced naturalists who wrongly conclude that there can be no place for religion in their lives. But presumably also to agnostics who are undecided about whether to believe in God, as well as to philosophically unsophisticated theists who might be persuaded by his "provocative overview" of philosophical challenges to theistic beliefs.

Cahn's take on the problem of evil illustrates both the strengths and weaknesses of his case against supernaturalism. His elucidation of John Hick's "solution" to the problem of evil is lucid and largely fair.[2] Cahn also concedes that, with sufficient ingenuity, theodicists such as Hick can provide explanations of why an all-powerful and all-knowing, all-good God would permit the evils that exist. Yet the problem is that, in a similar way, a sufficiently ingenious demonist could provide explanations of why an all-powerful, all-knowing, and all-evil demon would permit the goods that exist. Our world contains a more or less equal admixture of good and evil and, as a consequence, the evil that we encounter is equally compatible with the Demon hypothesis and with the God hypothesis. This might be doubted, of course. Hume may have thought that the world's evils vastly outweigh its goods. Paley did not. But the crucial point is that neither theism nor demonism can be conclusively verified or falsified by the empirical evidence. Both hypotheses fit (or can be made to fit) the empirical facts. So, other things being equal, a belief in one of the two hypotheses is neither more nor less rational than belief in the other. Both, in other words, are "dummy hypotheses, compatible with all possible [empirical] facts. Like a dummy bell rope that makes no sound, a dummy hypothesis makes no sense. Its compatibility with all possible [empirical] situations robs it of any explanatory power." A scientific hypothesis, on the other hand, "is typically tested by the following four step procedure: (1) formulate the hypothesis clearly; (2) work out the implications of the hypothesis; (3) perform controlled experiments to verify whether these implications hold; (4) observe the consequences of these experiments and, as a consequence, accept or reject the hypothesis" (p. 24).

But this is problematic. In the first place, theism and demonism are both large scale metaphysical hypotheses like idealism and realism, conjectures as to the nature of the world as a whole. Hypotheses like these can neither be fully established nor conclusively refuted by "controlled experiments." It doesn't follow, however, that they aren't verifiable or falsifiable in principle. H. P. Lovecraft's novels, for example, paint pictures of worlds that seem irredeemably tainted by evil. In those worlds, not only is evil extreme and almost universally pervasive, it is also (scientifically) inexplicable and uncanny. That the world is like that wouldn't entail that it is irredeemably evil but it is difficult to believe that it wouldn't pretty conclusively count against theism. Similarly, the occurrence of a "paradisical" world would strongly count against demonism though it wouldn't strictly entail its falsity.

Theism and demonism are both metaphysical hypotheses. But so too is naturalism -- as Cahn admits (p. 73). Metaphysical naturalism is, roughly, the denial of the existence of God or of any other supernatural reality. While metaphysical theism and metaphysical naturalism are clearly incompatible, it is less clear that the antecedent probability of the former is lower than the antecedent probability of the latter. Nor is it clear that these competing hypotheses are untestable. The existence of horrendous evils surely lowers the probability of metaphysical theism. On the other hand, the existence of other phenomena such as religious experience may raise it.

Cahn summarily dismisses the possibility that religious experience could raise metaphysical theism's probability on the grounds that purported "revelations" conflict. But there are serious responses to this (and other) objections to the cognitive value of (some) religious experiences, as Cahn well knows. One wonders whether they would prove convincing to an intelligent and fair minded inquirer who hadn't previously embraced metaphysical naturalism. If they would, then Cahn's argument against the probative character of this evidence for supernaturalism (and hence for metaphysical naturalism) would be implicitly circular. The more general point is that how one weighs the evidence for and against grand metaphysical hypotheses depends heavily on one's prior metaphysical predilections.[3] As a consequence, metaphysical theists and metaphysical naturalists can be expected to weigh the relevant evidence differently.

Cahn misrepresents theistic belief in several respects. For example, he argues that religious believers have little interest in "philosophical proofs for the existence of God . . . They apparently consider discussions of such proofs to be an intellectual game with little relevance to religious belief or activity." And Cahn quotes Kierkegaard who said "whoever . . . attempts to demonstrate the existence of God . . . [is] an excellent subject for a comedy of the higher lunacy" (p. 7). There are two things wrong with this, however. First, proofs of the existence of God often become relevant to ordinary believers when they are confronted with apparent disproofs of his existence (as Cahn admits, p. 11). But second, Kierkegaard is hardly representative of theism as a whole. Cahn's appeal to Kierkegaard ignores the central role that proofs have played and continue to play in Christian apologetics and in the devotional life of Christian intellectuals such as Anselm. And John Clayton, among others, has shown that they play a similar role in Vedanta, Nyaya Vaishseshika, and other theistic and nontheistic religious traditions.

Theists would also be unimpressed by Cahn's denigration of worship. He finds it unclear why God would be thought to want "our supplications and veneration" since he "is not supposed to have any needs." Moreover, "the goodness of God is not a reason because a good being would not want our worship" (p. 64). Theists think of God as their parent but "sensible parents do not wish to be the object of their children's worship" (as distinguished from their respect, love, and gratitude). Worship is thus doubly irrational. It is irrational because theism is irrational, and even if it weren't reason informs us that if God were to exist, he would not want us to worship him.

But Cahn's argument is flawed because it fails to come to grips with the principal reason why traditional theists believe that worship is not only appropriate but mandatory. Traditional Christian theism, for example, maintains that God is not one being among others but Goodness itself -- a good in comparison with which all other goods pale to insignificance[4] -- and therefore not on a ontological par with human parents or any other finite being. God's identification with the Good explains why worship is appropriate. It is appropriate because it is a fitting response to its object, and because it is a way of closing with the Good.

Cahn rejects the view that "if God doesn't exist our lives are somehow diminished." Consider a life devoted "to teaching philosophy . . . or composing music or providing medical care to the sick or cultivating a garden or raising a family." All these activities are meaningful and none "depend on the existence of God, [yet] all provide life with significance" (pp. 81-82). Moreover, metaphysical naturalists, too, can beneficially engage in "religious practices." These practices aren't centered on God or some other supernatural entity, however, but on goals and ideals, and on a solidarity with a community of men and women who are committed to them. They include public readings of texts that have played a central role in the history of one's community, formal recommitments to the community and its ideals, the singing of hymns and songs expressing and celebrating one's own and one's community's commitment to its goals and ideals, private and public meditation on those goals and ideals, and so on.[5] But while all this is true, it doesn't follow that a life without God isn't a diminished life. It is if God is the Good and a life with the Good is both possible and desirable, as Plato and many others have believed.

Why doesn't Cahn take views like this seriously? I strongly suspect it is because he regards them as nonsense. Attempts to articulate views of this sort depend heavily on negative theology, which he dismisses (p, 42),[6] and metaphor, which he believes is cognitively meaningful only if its cognitive content can be expressed literally. But both claims are questionable. In the first place, metaphors should be distinguished from analogies and from similes or likeness statements. The latter, if true at all, are literally true although the likenesses in question can't always be expressed by a property or set of properties which both terms of the comparison literally possess.[7] Analogies, too, are understood literally. For example, interpreting "God knows" as "God possesses a property, P, which stands to him as human knowledge stands to us" yields a proposition which is, again, literally true if true at all. Moreover, many poetic metaphors or symbolic works of fiction express truths which cannot be exhaustively expressed in finite sets of literal truths.[8] Finally, the thrust of most negative theology is to insist that claims like "God knows" must be understood analogically or as similes or metaphors.

In spite of these criticisms, I enjoyed reading Cahn's book and expect that others will too. It is lucid, very well written, and packed with imaginative illustrations and examples. I also believe that it could be happily and effectively used in a lower division philosophy class if paired with an equally lucid and clearly argued defense of theism that is itself aimed at a popular audience.[9]


[1] In fairness to Cahn it should be noted that his failure to address these disputes and others like them is the consequence of a deliberate decision "not to grapple with the voluminous technical literature that has developed over the past several decades" dealing with issues of this sort (p. ix).

[2] But it is doubtful that Hick and other theodicists believe "that we live in the best possible world and that all evils are logically necessary for the good" (p. 14). Some, like Plantinga, think that while there may be better worlds, this is the best world that God could create. Moreover, what Hick believes is logically necessary for the good of moral growth is the real (and not merely logical) possibility of evil.

[3] If any. But as William James and others have argued, (1) it is doubtful that there are very many inquirers who don't antecedently lean towards one of these hypothesis rather than the other, or (2) that the antecedent weightings of those who don't lean toward one hypothesis or the other should be privileged over the antecedent weightings of those who do.

[4] Goodness itself is incommensurable with other goods, that is, it isn't merely two times greater, or three times greater, or nine hundred and ninety nine times greater, etc., etc., than other goods.

[5] These are not new ideas of course. Similar views were expressed by John Dewey and Henry Wieman among others.

[6] "For example, to say 'God knows' is to deny that God does not know . . . But to deny that someone does not possess knowledge is to affirm that the individual does possess knowledge. If that implication does not hold, we fail to understand the meaning of our own words" (p. 42).

[7] The color scarlet is like the sound of a trumpet, for instance.

[8] Melville's white whale is an example. Dante's description of heaven in his Paradiso is another. (Compare the latter with the rather puerile descriptions of heaven discussed and dismissed in Chapter 17 ("Heaven and Hell")).

[9] Something along the lines of C. S. Lewis's On Pain or On Miracles, for example (although not necessarily those particular books).