It’s a well-kept secret, but we’re living in a golden age of philosophical art criticism. In recent years a handful of philosophers, equipped with a deep and well-informed love of particular works of art and insights gleaned from philosophy’s long-running debates about mind, knowledge, meaning, and agency, have turned themselves into exemplary critics, clarifying and enriching the terms on which art is understood and valued these days, even by artists. One of the most distinguished of these philosopher-critics is Richard Wollheim. In his 1984 Mellon Lectures, published in 1987 as Painting as an Art, he offered fresh, compelling, intricately crafted readings of such painters as Poussin, Ingres, Manet, and Picasso, and he used these readings to present and defend a distinctive account of the nature and sources of pictorial meaning, an account he continues to defend and refine.
Wollheim gave “On Pictorial Representation” as the Gareth Evans Memorial Lecture at Oxford in 1996; it then became the topic of a symposium published in the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism in 1998. In 1997 van Gerwen organized an interdisciplinary conference on Wollheim’s work at the University of Utrecht. The current volume begins with the Wollheim’s Oxford lecture, pools papers from the JAAC symposium with papers from the Utrecht conference, and concludes with concise but trenchant replies by Wollheim to his critics. The result is a rich and varied sample of the ways his work has been taken up and argued with so far.
The sample is far from comprehensive. Some of Wollheim’s most persistent and eloquent critics are missing from the volume, notably Kendall Walton. So are some of the less familiar kinds of pictorial meaning discussed in the Mellon Lectures, notably visual metaphor. Some of the contributors have written about him at greater length and to better effect elsewhere. The Utrecht pieces are often programmatic, sketchy, and breathlessly, breathtakingly brief. In no way does this volume constitute an introduction to Wollheim’s work. But anyone who cares about the philosophy of painting will want to study it and come to terms with it at some point.
1. Paintings bear various kinds of meaning or content: they represent particular objects, people, scenes, and events from more or less determinate points of view; they express particular moods and emotions; sometimes they convey a sense of a represented corner of the world as seen through and subjectively colored by the more or less determinate temperament of a more or less determinate hypothetical spectator, an internal spectator, whose view of and role in that corner of the world we actual spectators are induced to imaginatively assume.
Like his predecessor E.H. Gombrich in Art and Illusion, Wollheim advocates an account of pictorial meaning that is psychological and broadly Gricean (or “retrievalist”) in flavor. Psychological, in that it takes pictorial meanings to be constituted by experiences a painting affords its spectators when they view it appropriately. Broadly Gricean, in that it takes the standard of appropriate viewing to be set by how the painter intends suitably qualified spectators to view his work, if and to the extent that:
(a) he paints so as to make it possible for them to view his work as he intends, and
(b) he paints so as to make his intention that they view it in this way something they can infer — “retrieve” — and govern themselves by in their dealings with the work.
If or to the extent these conditions aren’t met, a painting lacks determinate pictorial meaning and therefore fails as a painting. A painter’s efforts to intend an experience genuinely worth having, his efforts to make that experience genuinely available from his work, and his efforts to make his intentions for the work retrievable by spectators interpenetrate, succeeding or failing together and by stages as he watches his work proceed toward completion under his hands. A spectator’s effort to retrieve a painter’s intentions and her effort to conform with them once she has retrieved them also interpenetrate, succeeding or failing together and by stages as her acquaintance with the finished work deepens.
Wollheim thinks the experiences that go to constitute pictorial meanings belong to kinds of experience that would be in our repertoire even if painting had never been invented. In the case of representation, they are experiences of seeing something that isn’t literally before one’s eyes in a surface that literally is — as when we see absent, fictitious, or merely generic people or animals in the mud spots on a moldering wall. In the case of expression, they are experiences of finding a stretch of our visible environment to be of a piece with and ready to accommodate an already familiar kind of feeling or emotion, in a sense I’ll attempt to explain below. In the case of internal spectatorship, they are experiences of imagining from within what it might be like to inhabit a particular corner of the world, equipped with particular designs on and feelings about the corner in question. Pictorial meaning is what becomes of such pre-existing kinds of experience when they fall under the sway of an ongoing cultural practice, within which:
(a) experiences of a painted surface count as correct only insofar as they accord with the painter’s retrievable intentions, and
(b) would-be painters, would-be spectators, and interested third parties collaborate in keeping the retrieval of painters’ intentions durably feasible and durably authoritative for how spectators try to view paintings.
Several contributors to the current volume press worries about this general conception of pictorial meaning.
Andrew Harrison is impressed with the fact that pictures are structural analogues of the things they represent: the representation of a whole is typically built from representations of various of its salient parts, where the representations of the parts are assembled in the representation of the whole in ways that at least roughly parallel the ways in which the parts are assembled in the thing itself. (Think of stick-figure representations of people.) He also notices that parts of any given picture smaller than a certain critical size, what he calls “the mesh,” can’t be said to have a determinate representational content of their own. (Only in the context of a stick figure does a line depict a human trunk, and even there, a determinate segment of the whole line can’t be said to represent a determinate portion of the corresponding trunk.) Harrison thinks this allows us to view pictures as assemblages of separately meaningful atomic elements meaningfully arranged, where the meaning of the whole is a function of the meaning of its minimal separately meaningful atomic elements (on the one hand) and the various particular meaningful manners in which these separately meaningful elements have been arranged (on the other). So we can at least begin to account for representation in terms of a “pictorial syntax” and “pictorial semantics,” bypassing reference to the intentions of painters and the experiences of spectators.
Like semiotic proposals about pictures and picturing made by Goodman and others back in the seventies, this proposal ignores deep disanalogies between pictures and natural language. Suppose we allow that each new picture includes its own stock of minimal separately meaningful elements: each of these elements is such that it in particular represents some determinate part of a scene, given its context in this particular picture, where this can’t be said of any of its proper parts. Suppose we even allow something that is in general much less plausible: that each new picture also includes its own finite stock of ways of assembling representationally meaningful elements to representationally meaningful effect, such that whenever one of these modes of assembly is employed in this particular picture, the representational meaning of the resulting arrangement is a fixed function of the individual representational meanings of the individual arranged pictorial elements. The trouble is, the minimal separately meaningful elements don’t bring determinate representational meanings with them to a given picture as something settled prior to their concrete deployment in this very picture. To miss this is to lose track of what “separately meaningful” comes to in the present context. Nor do modes of assembly for pictorial elements bring any determinate representational effect with them to a given picture as something already settled. To miss that is to confuse an after-the-fact functional dependence with before-the-fact causal-explanatory dependence. Making sense of a sentence, map, or diagram always can and often must proceed from the bottom up; making sense of a picture, by contrast, characteristically proceeds from the top down. Advocates of pictorial syntax and semantics ignore this difference at their peril.
Carolyn Wilde concurs with Wollheim in wanting an account of pictorial content that is psychological and experiential in character, yet she is eager to deny that “some separable optative thought on the part of the artist” (124) exercises special authority over how others should interpret his work. Instead she draws on the phenomenologist Merleau-Ponty and the idealist aesthetician Bosanquet to urge:
(a) that the only medium in which the painter thinks to directly pertinent effect is the medium in which he paints, and
(b) that the “intentionality” of the thinking that goes on in paint is a matter of “social and public understanding” and is therefore constituted multilaterally by painters and spectators working together.
Retrievalism is controversial and deservedly so, as debates about the so-called intentional fallacy attest. But the intentions Wollheim regards as determinative of content will often be ones the painter himself can formulate only by referring to the developing look of his own work-in-progress; Wollheim’s view doesn’t involve a separable optative thought of the kind Wilde rightly finds incredible. Besides, once we avoid confusing “intentionality” in the sense of the presence of intention and “intentionality” in the sense of the presence of aboutness, it may occur to us that I can think in a given medium, whether private and mental or public and physical, only if that medium is subject to purposive deployment and redeployment by me in the service of my own developing trains of thought. When one thinks in a medium, what one thinks in it depends on how (and in response to what) one purposively manipulates the medium in which one thinks. If this is right, the only person in a position to literally think in paint is the one who’s literally in a position to push the paint around: the painter. Wilde’s two basic contentions about thinking in paint seem to be in profound tension with one another.
Wollheim takes the painter’s basic content-conferring intention to be a hypothetical one: if my work eventually finds spectators other than myself, let them too experience it thus. Anthony Savile thinks this leaves him ill-placed to account for the sustainability over time of public artistic practices and institutions. A cultural practice like painting can sustain itself successfully over time only if the participants who help to secure its continued viability and intelligibility, artists and patrons alike, are adequately compensated for their efforts. This will happen only if artists (often enough) categorically intend that patrons in general understand and value their work in some particular way — only if art is in this sense (often enough) categorically communicative in its intent. Yet an artist can’t expect patrons in general to make special hermeneutic efforts to retrieve and govern themselves by his intentions. Instead, categorically communicative art must be such that the way its maker intends it to be understood and valued is the way patrons in general are predisposed to understand and value it, regardless of his intentions.
For this to be possible, there must be some one way patrons in general are predisposed to understand and value a work like this — a work with this particular set of intrinsic configurational features — in the first place. A self-sustaining cultural practice must subject disparate, autonomously formed understandings and valuings on the part of individual would-be artists and individual would-be patrons to modification under each other’s influence, until there is (often enough) some one way patrons in general are predisposed to understand and value a work with such and such configurational features. These generally prevailing default understandings and valuings for works of given configurations are the cultural counterpart of generally prevailing market prices for given amounts of given commodities. Where generally prevailing prices are set by processes of competitive bidding in which the preferences of special transaction-initiating economic agents (sellers) lack special weight, generally prevailing default understandings and valuings are set by processes of artworld “negotiation” in which the preferences of special transaction-initiating cultural agents (artists) likewise lack special weight. Where generally prevailing default understandings and valuings of a lawfully patterned kind exist in a given community, we have what amounts to a system of collaboratively maintained “communicative conventions, rules, and norms,” able (again, often enough) to confer determinate meaning and value on a novel work without reference to and thus in potential defiance of its particular maker’s actual intentions. So painting must involve such conventions, rules, and norms, and a particular painting may sometimes mean something that its maker in no sense intended.
The argument is a subtle one, with intricate relations to famous arguments in Saussure about the relation between langue and parole, yet it seems to me to stumble at an early step. Grant that artists must often have categorically communicative intentions and can’t reasonably expect elaborate hermeneutic exercises from spectators in general each time out. It still won’t follow that they must rely instead on default understandings and valuings provided for in advance by conventions, rules, or norms already in place in the relevant artworld. As neo-Griceans such as Sperber and Wilson have emphasized, “uncoded communication,” communication unsupported by any standing convention to the effect that this means that or any standing expectation that this is likely to mean that, is often a remarkably casual and effortless affair, making no costly hermeneutic demands on its audience. One must just arrange to make the relevant inference on the audience’s part sufficiently easy and automatic. If someone asks you how you’re feeling today, and you take a bottle of aspirin from your purse and look down at it conspicuously, your audience will effortlessly see what you mean, and your communicative feat would require no standing convention, rule, or norm to the effect that displayed aspirin bottles mean “I’ve got a headache.”
2. Representation and Seeing in. Sometimes our experience of a differentiated flat surface involves two distinct aspects:
(a) a configurational aspect, thanks to which we are visually aware (in a manner that is mostly veridical as far as it goes) of the surface itself and its variations in local color; and
(b) a recognitional aspect, thanks to which we are visually aware of various robustly three-dimensional things, things that aren’t and aren’t believed to be before our eyes at the time — in some cases, “things” that may no longer exist (Napoleon), may never have existed (Icarus), or may be merely generic in character (a brown-haired woman in a pink gown holding violets who isn’t any particular woman holding any particular violets).1
These two awarenesses are said to be distinguishable but inseparable aspects of a single experience, an experience of seeing-in: seeing the relevant three-dimensional things in the relevant surface. The configurational aspect can be described on analogy with a veridical simple seeing of a differentiated surface, which it resembles both intrinsically and in functional role. The recognitional aspect can be described on analogy with a face-to-face seeing of the things we in fact merely see in the surface (or alternatively, on analogy with an optically unaided visualization of those same things). Yet I can be aware of a differentiated surface in the particular way exhibited here only by using the surface to discern absent three-dimensional things; and I can be aware of discerned absent things in the particular way exhibited here only by being aware of a differentiated surface whose features enable me to discern them in it. In at least this sense, (a) and (b) are inseparable aspects of a single experience rather than independent experiences that happen to occur simultaneously. And though they can be described on analogy with the simpler experiences just mentioned, there is a sense in which a detailed point-for-point comparison between them and such simpler experiences is out of the question: seeing-in and the simpler experiences to which it is in various ways analogous are “phenomenologically incommensurate.”2 Such, Wollheim thinks, is the twofoldness involved in seeing-in. A painting represents a given subject matter when we are retrievably intended to see that subject matter in its surface and can indeed do so.
Paul Crowther wants to embrace this account and incorporate it into a broader survey of the basic functions of “imagination,” where imagination is understood, following Kant, as the iconic representation of objects that aren’t now present to the senses, “a blind yet indispensable function of the soul” which performs its most important work without explicit conscious supervision from its possessor and allows human thinking to occur at a distance from its concrete motivating occasions (in ways which differentiate it from animal thinking). I’m not sure what to make of this suggestion pending further details. To judge from his exchanges with Kendall Walton over the years, Wollheim himself believes that there is no unitary mental faculty called “the imagination”; that an unmanageably heterogeneous range of mental activities are reported using the term “imagine” and its derivatives; and that the term imagination is best reserved for efforts to envisage from within the subjective experience of someone in a given set of objective circumstances. If one agrees with Wollheim about all this, one won’t regard seeing-in as a species of imaginative activity.
Wollheim has pointed out that since our experience of trompe l’oeil paintings isn’t characterized by twofoldness, trompe l’oeil paintings don’t count as representations by his standards. This troubles Jerrold Levinson, who wants to replace the notion of seeing-in explained by Wollheim with a less demanding notion that doesn’t require configurational awareness. His candidate is seeing-from, where one sees object X from design D if and only if:
(a) actually looking at D gives one the impression of seeing X, makes it seem to one as if one is seeing X, and
(b) the impression or seeming in question is caused by mechanisms appropriately similar to those it would be caused by in an actual face-to-face seeing of X.
(Having the impression of seeing X needn’t involve the slightest tendency to believe that X is actually before one’s eyes.) Levinson insists on this change in part because he wants to treat trompe-l’oeil paintings as representations, in part because he thinks that when we look at pictures whose means of depiction are routine and of little aesthetic interest (e.g. passport photos), we lack interest in and hence awareness of the configurational properties responsible for our experience. This seems to me to confuse what we’re aware of with what we attend to. Lack of interest may sometimes extinguish attention, but it isn’t enough to extinguish awareness, as those of us who bore easily know all too well. In any case, I don’t know how to interpret the notion of being under the impression of seeing X so as to get this proposal off the ground. To experience the subject matter of a Rembrandt sketch I must remain vividly aware that I’m seeing a monochromatic display of lines and splotches; it is by actively construing this display that I made aware of this subject matter. So how can I be under the impression as I do so that I’m seeing a multicolored scene with edges in place of the lines?
Susan Feagin embraces Wollheim’s conclusion that trompe-l’oeil isn’t a species of representation, offers a positive account of what she calls trompe l’oeil presentation, and explores the aesthetic and cognitive interest of some famous examples of the genre. The account is engaging and perceptive, but it cries out for actual illustrations — and for certain distinctions that Feagin doesn’t draw. One is that between looking as much as possible like another thing and giving the illusion of being that other thing. Another is that between two semantically different kinds of trompe l’oeil, the kind where the painted surface dresses up as the surface of some other substance (wood, marble, …) and the kind where the painted surface disappears from sight and we instead seem to see various three-dimensional objects in front of or behind it (feathers, calling cards, crumpled envelopes, …).
Monique Roelofs wants to supplement Wollheim’s account of seeing-in with a more psychologically revealing account of its recognitional aspect. Her suggestion, if I understand it, is that when we see X in D, the recognitional aspect of our experience consists in the entertaining by our visual system of a “perceptual hypothesis” ascribing to some part of D the property of being some part of the surface of X. (The hypothesis in question is entertained at a “level of commitment” higher than that involved in mere imagining yet lower than that involved in full-fledged perceptual belief.) Roelof’s account seems to require that determinate parts of a picture’s surface be seen as determinate parts of the subject’s surface, a requirement Wollheim himself had repudiated by the time he wrote Painting as an Art. Her account may provide for things being seen at a particular locations on the painting’s surface (those to which the relevant concepts are applied), but it doesn’t provide for their being seen at particular depths in the space of a painting: it’s not so much an account of seeing-in as an account of seeing-on. It’s also a surprisingly old-fashioned account, despite its appeals to Fodor, Eleanor Rosch, and Paul Churchland. Roelofs holds that ordinary perceptual judgments involve applying a concept to a sensory presentation on the basis of criteria; she holds that sensory presentations reside fully in their possessor’s awareness and are structured enough like pictures for our awareness of the surface of a picture to be treated as a special case of awareness of a visual field; she holds that concept-applying mental states come in differing degrees of vivacity or liveliness, with belief constituted by sufficiently lively conception. Such doctrines figured prominently in various classical empiricisms. For all I know they are ripe for revival. But they certainly aren’t commonplaces of contemporary cognitive science.
I turn next to Wollheim’s own contribution to this volume, “On Pictorial Representation.” In Painting as an Art he briefly discussed what he called the fact of transfer: once we’ve familiarized ourselves with the relevant general pictorial idiom, we can learn to recognize representations of Fs by having actual Fs pointed out to us in the world, or we can learn to recognize actual Fs by having represented Fs pointed out to us in pictures. An account of what representation is should accommodate this fact; a developed account of how representation works should explain it. A first step in accommodating transfer is to contend that what a picture represents is determined by the content of some appropriate visual experience, obtainable from the picture on certain appropriate terms. A second step is to contend that if a picture represents a (possibly nonexistent) F as such, the appropriate experience must be one in which we are visually aware of a (possibly nonexistent) F as such, in that, given suitable prompting, the Fness of the F in question would come to be part of the visually presented content of the appropriate visual experience. Wollheim thinks these two principles powerfully constrain accounts of pictorial representation. He uses them to mount new and powerful objections to accounts in terms of pictorial syntax and semantics (Goodman, Harrison, etc.) and to accounts in terms of an experienced resemblance between the “visual fields” provided by pictures and their subjects (Christopher Peacocke, Malcolm Budd).
The transfer principles might seem to imply that the only properties things can be represented as having are those they could straightforwardly be seen to have when looking at them face to face. But Wollheim goes on to urge that this isn’t the case: the visual experiences appropriate to paintings can be “permeated by thought” so as to afford them a content richer than that of any veridical face-to-face seeing.
An already familiar kind of visual experience that exhibits excess content in virtue of permeation by thought is the activity of visualizing, so Wollheim turns in closing to accounts of representation he reads as involving visualizing. In particular, he criticizes Walton’s account, which makes representation turn on imagining about one’s seeing of the painted surface that it is a seeing of the subject instead, and where something like twofoldness is secured by a requirement that the veridical experience of the surface and the imaginary experience of the face together constitute “a single phenomenological whole.”3
Wollheim concedes that in moving my hands around I can imagine myself to be conducting an orchestra, and in looking hard at an enemy I can imagine setting him on fire with my gaze. That is, I can engage in these activities in such a way that my doing them in that way counts as my imagining I am doing something else. But in doing one perceptual thing (looking at a painted surface), I can’t imagine that I am doing something other perceptual thing (looking at a face) instead. “For, if we succeed, what is left of seeing the surface when I successfully imagine it to be some other experience? However, if I do continue to see the surface, or this experience retains its content, how have I succeeded in imagining it, the experience, to be an experience of seeing a face?” (25). The best interpretation I’m able to put on this complaint goes as follows:
(a) Like Wollheim, Walton wants to regard configurational awareness and recognitional awareness as aspects of a single visual experience.
(b) Therefore we aren’t to suppose I have two separate simultaneous experiences, a seeing of the surface plus an imagining (as it were from outside) about this seeing of a surface that it is a seeing of a face instead.
© Rather we must suppose that in seeing the surface as I do, I imagine myself seeing a face instead, where this means that I see the surface in such a way that so seeing it already counts as imagining seeing, hence visualizing, the face instead.
(d) For this to be the case, my experience of seeing the surface would need to be simultaneously (i) a visual experience (in particular, a seeing) that is unambiguously and as a whole to the effect that a surface is before my eyes and thus and so, and (ii) a visual experience (in particular, a visualizing) that is unambiguously and as a whole to the effect that a face is before my eyes and thus and so.
(e) Yet no single visual experience can be unambiguously and as a whole to two different and incompatible propositional effects.
Questions could be raised about (e), but I’ll confine myself here to challenging (b). Walton requires that perceiving and imagining “constitute a single phenomenal whole” in this respect: we see what we do only because of what we are imagining and imagine what we do only because of what we are seeing, and the dependence relations in both directions are intimate and intricate; many different small variations in what we see would entail many different small variations in what we imagine (and vice versa). Walton doesn’t require that they constitute a single phenomenal whole in the stronger sense that they each consist exclusively in one and the same token visual experience, and I’m not sure what phenomenological evidence Wollheim could offer for this stronger singularity claim once the two are distinguished. (Walton’s account may be vulnerable to charges that it can’t explain the possibility of transfer, or to charges that the conditions it lays down aren’t sufficient for representation, but I can’t pursue such charges here.)
Walton retains the overall structure of Wollheim’s account of representation, with its contrast between configurational and recognitional aspects. But he holds that imagining is involved in and helps to explain the recognitional aspect of seeing-in — something Wollheim himself has consistently denied. And he requires that imaginings shape the content and structure of configurational awareness, the content and structure of what we straightforwardly see before our eyes, with the result that the configurational side of seeing-in can’t be regarded as prior to its recognitional side in any comprehensive sense.
These same departures from Wollheim recur in another recent account of seeing-in by the art historian Michael Podro. Podro takes over from Wollheim’s Art and Its Objects the suggestion that a pictorial representation proposes a kind of analogy or figurative likening whose terms are the marked surface D on the one hand and the subject X on the other. He takes over from I.A. Richards and Max Black an interactionist view of figuration, on which every really deep analogy restructures our thinking about both its terms, reshaping our thought about each on the model of our thought about the other, in ways that derive their power and interest from a continued appreciation of how different the terms are in other respects.
On the recognitional side of things, Podro insists that for representation to occur, it isn’t enough that our inspection of the surface design D activate our capacity to recognize subject X in X’s acknowledged absence. We must go on to exploit our recognition of X in a sustained, successful effort to visualize X. (He might contend that this is an important difference between representations proper and the stylized minimal message-bearing icons encountered on airport signs, images whose interest as images is exhausted as soon as we recognize in them a lit cigarette, a suitcase, a woman wearing a dress.)
On the configurational side of things, he insists that when representation occurs, our awareness of a painted surface D is never simply an awareness that D is differentiated in particular ways (lighter here, darker there; redder here, greener there); it is always an awareness of D in terms of how we suppose these differentiations came into being, how we suppose the artist to have made his marks, how we take him to have handled his medium — an awareness, then, in terms of actual or hypothetical productive activity. There are at least two departures from Wollheim on this side of things. There is now a difference in structure and therefore a difference in kind between the configurational aspect of seeing a subject in a picture and the configurational aspect of (say) seeing a camel in the clouds. Representation is no longer the capture by a cultural practice of a mode of experience we humans already had in our phenomenological repertoire. And configurational awareness is no longer largely veridical as far as it goes; the impressions a painter’s marks give us about the manner of their own making may be as designedly fanciful as the impressions a dancer’s movements give about the manner of their making.
The detailed appreciation of a pictorial representation is in large part a reconstruction of how configurational and recognitional awareness restructure each other as we search the represented subject for real or fancied counterparts of the organizations, energies, gestures, etc. already discerned in way the surface has been worked. There is no determinate border between the two awarenesses, by which Podro means:
(a) that two awarenesses overlap, in time and in psychic constituents, and
(b) that there is no telling how deep the analogy between design and subject runs or where it will give out on us — it feels inexhaustible.
Podro’s account is so bound up with the readings of particular works he has used to elaborate it that I can’t begin to do justice to it here; it’s one of the most important and perplexing developments the philosophy of painting has seen of late, and his presentation of it in this volume should be read alongside his 1998 book Depiction.
3. Expression and Correspondence. Sometimes we find ourselves in a state of mind we abhor and experience as threatening to us, or a state of mind we prize but experience as threatened by us. In either case we are anxious. Our anxiety is relieved if we manage to picture our state of mind as so much relocatable corporeal stuff and imaginatively re-house it in a perceivable external object, thereby rendering ourselves safe from the state (in the first case) or the state safe from us (in the second). Wollheim calls this complex projection; the idea comes from psychoanalytic theories of mental activity in the Kleinian tradition.4 Almost any state of mind can be rehoused in almost any perceivable object, but the effect will be unstable and the relief from anxiety short-lived unless the chosen object is accommodating — such as to stablely sustain the projection of the particular state of mind we rehouse in it. Eventually we become disposed to experience objects in terms of their sensed readiness to stably accommodate the projection of (say) melancholy in the circumstances at hand, much as we eventually become disposed to experience objects we call fragile in terms of their sensed readiness to break in the circumstances at hand. (The analogy is mine, not Wollheim’s.)
Experiencing a thing as fragile isn’t simply a matter of taking it to be prone to break on the basis of how it looks. Fragility is itself part of how things look (or feel or sound), a sensible quality in its own right, one we acquire the ability to see and feel and hear as we gain experience with objects that from time to time break on us. Fragility is a proneness to break made sensibly manifest in a certain familiar way. Sensing a thing’s fragility is an experience we must learn to undergo, an experience which mobilizes affect-laden memories of what we did and suffered in past episodes of breaking things or letting them break. Similarly, Wollheim urges, there is such a thing as a sensibly manifest readiness to accommodate the projection of melancholy, and this is a sensible quality in its own right. He calls this quality corresponding to or being of a piece with melancholy, and he takes it to be what we report when we say of a landscape that it has a melancholy look to it or a melancholy air about it. Sensing such a correspondence is an experience we must learn to undergo, an experience mobilizing affect-laden memories of what we did or suffered in past episodes of projecting our own melancholy onto things, an experience which “intimates a history” involving past projective activity.5
Just how the needed mobilization of memories works is something about which Wollheim sends mixed signals. This much seems clear: up to a point, we respond to the thing that corresponds to melancholy and is thus ready to accommodate projected melancholy as if it had already done so, hence as if we were already in the presence of a suitably transmuted, suitably rehoused case of melancholy — with the result that (again, up to a point) we respond to the thing before our eyes as if we were in the potent presence of a potently melancholy person. Whether this means we need to feel susceptible to being infected with melancholy by the thing before our eyes, and if so, whether actual melancholy on our part needs to figure in our felt susceptibility to infection with it, are matters left tantalizingly up in the air.
In any case, Wollheim proposes that a painting (or one of its parts or elements or aspects) expresses (say) melancholy just in case we are retrievably intended to experience it as corresponding to melancholy and can indeed do so.
Wollheim’s account of expression is more speculative and psychoanalytic in flavor than his accounts of representation and internal spectatorship. His expositions of it are terse and short on concrete illustration; so far he has made relatively little use of it in interpretations of particular paintings. The treatments of it in these pages are pretty skeptical in tone and substance.
In “The Sheep and the Ceremony”6 and again in Painting as an Art, Wollheim seemed to be working with an ebb-and-flow model of the experience of correspondence. On this model, an individual experience of a given object as corresponding to a given emotion always comes in the immediate wake of successful projection by this very spectator of this very emotion onto that very object, and the affective dimension of the experience of correspondence involves at least a felt tendency to feel this same emotion over again under the object’s influence. In projection, an emotion ebbs out of us into a perceivable external thing; then, in experienced correspondence, the same emotion flow backs into us from the thing now housing it — or at least, it is poised to do so if we let it. This same emotion — or at least, a felt tendency to feel it, a tendency we may often successfully resist — constitutes the affective dimension of the experience of correspondence. And what (if anything) we feel or tend to feel this emotion about is the object poised to instill it in us here and now if we let it, the object we experience here and now as corresponding to the emotion in question. In short, the object of our present-day affect (if any) is its present-day cause.
In “Correspondence, Projective Properties, and Expression in the Arts,” the ebb-and-flow model is abandoned for a more complicated one, on which projections funding a present-day experience of correspondence are often distant in time (they can be and often are episodes from early childhood development) and in space (they can be and often are projections onto objects distinct from and merely analogous to the one now experienced as corresponding to the feeling in question). There is also a general loosening up in Wollheim’s conception of how affect figures in the experience of correspondence. I count three components in this general loosening up:
(a) The evoked affect in question (e.g. fear, or a felt tendency thereto) no longer concerns itself exclusively with its present-day instigator: it also concerns itself with objects out of the subject’s distant past. (b) The evocation of affect in question no longer consists exclusively in its recurrence (or a felt tendency thereto) here and now; it also involves experiential memories of past affect and patterns thereof. © The emotion figuring in the present-day affect need no longer be the very kind of emotion we projected onto a kindred object at some time in the past, the very kind of emotion we experience the object as corresponding to; instead it may be some second kind of emotion that constitutes a spontaneous and appropriate response to the occurrence of the first one in others around us — in the way in which, for instance, fear often constitutes a spontaneous and appropriate response to rage in others.7
Malcolm Budd reviews some of these changes at the opening of his essay. He notices that according to Wollheim’s later formulations, experiences of correspondence are often distant in time and space from the acts of projection that allegedly fund them. He decides Wollheim needs to offer compelling evidence that such experiences, e.g. experiences of things as having a melancholy look to them or a melancholy air about them, do and indeed must originate in otherwise long-lost acts of projection. Wollheim does say at several points that experiences of correspondence “intimate” about themselves that they have a projective origin. Budd takes these remarks to be his attempt to shoulder the evidential burden just mentioned. The attempt fails, in Budd’s opinion. An experience can non-question-beggingly intimate a particular origin (for itself, or for experiences of its kind more generally) only if the origin in question “must announce itself to us when we reflect on the experience in order to determine if it tells us this about itself” (106, my emphasis). No such origin announces itself to Budd himself, when he reflects on his own experiences of correspondence. But suppose it had, Budd continues. The most this would show is that the experiences of correspondence we actually have do in fact originate in acts of projection. There is no reason to suppose that only experiences possessing (or purporting to possess) a particular origin can possess a particular content. So even if Budd’s reflection on his own experience had gone in Wollheim’s favor, it would do nothing to show that experiences of correspondence must originate in acts of projection — which is what Wollheim needs if analyzing experienced correspondence in terms of projection is to be in the cards. Even if our actual experiences of correspondence do in fact originate in projection, other experiences with the very same content might not. Experiences possess only contingently the typical origins they actually do possess.
There is plenty to dissent from here. Let me start at the end of Budd’s argument and work back.
Among Wollheim’s examples of experiences intimating something about their own origins are (i) physical pains intimating that they originate in damage to a particular part of the body, the part that hurts, and (ii) experiential memories intimating that they originate in firsthand experience of an past event, the event they purport to remember. Insofar as physical pains do their job in enabling us avoid death and injury, insofar as experiential memories do their job in reliably informing us about our personal pasts, experiences of these kinds not only do but must originate in the ways just sketched, at least as a general rule. And if states of mind were sufficiently bad at doing these jobs, they wouldn’t have the roles in our ongoing lives that make them count as pains and memories in the first place. Familiar kinds of experience often necessarily possess the typical origins they actually possess.
We can go further. Only insofar as we tacitly understand our pains to originate in appropriate kinds of bodily damage, only insofar as we tacitly understand our memories to originate in appropriate kinds of past experience, will we be able to take appropriate account of them in deliberate conscious thought about our own bodies and our own pasts. Only insofar as we take appropriate account of them in deliberate conscious thinking will they be able to do their characteristic jobs, the jobs that make them pains and memories in the first place. Yet we won’t understand the states in question to have the origins in question unless the states themselves encourage us to understand them as having these origins, unless in this sense the states intimate that they and others of their respective kinds originated in these ways. Familiar kinds of experience often do and often must intimate particular things about their own origins, things which must be true at least as a general rule.
If we think about intimation in this way, we’ll regard Budd’s test for what a mental state intimates about itself as far too crude: not everything a state intimates about itself is proclaimed out loud to the state’s possessor as soon as she reflects. Discovering what a state intimates about itself may require sustained, empirically informed, philosophically controversial argument about the role the state in question characteristically plays in our lives.
Less turns on this than Budd thinks: he overestimates the weight intimations of origin are asked to bear in Wollheim’s overall argument. Intimations of origin do indicate why and how our ability to see things as corresponding to feelings is in fact an acquired ability; they call attention to the role memories play in helping to constitute typical experiences of correspondence; their archaic details signal the decisive importance of early acts of projection in shaping our current sense of what corresponds to what. But it isn’t the origin of experiences of correspondence that gives projection its role in accounting for them; it is the very content of these experiences. Empirically informed reflection on the role of a mental state in our lives is vital not just to discovering what it intimates about itself, but to discovering what it says about the world in its first place — not just to asking about its origins but also to asking about its content.
This provides a different way to read Wollheim’s arguments, a way I find much more promising. From time to time things wear in our eyes something we call a look or air of melancholy. When this happens, the emotion we call melancholy figures in the content of our perceptual experience, but it isn’t immediately clear how it figures. To spell out to ourselves the content such experiences already have for us, we need to infer this content from the roles experiences of the relevant “look” or “air” are observed to play in the general economy of our psychological lives. There are two distinct cases to consider.
(a) When I am anxious in the grip of a particular emotion, almost anything can come to wear for me the look or air of that emotion temporarily under the emotion’s influence. What temporary three-place relation (among me, the emotion in question, and the perceivable thing in question) is thereby represented?
(b) Certain particular things are so constituted that they wear the air or look of some particular emotion more or less permanently (in particular circumstances of viewing), regardless of my inner state at the time I view them and regardless of who in particular I happen to be. What standing two-place relation (between the emotion in question and the perceivable thing in question) is thereby represented?
Such is our content problem. Here are some data with which to address it. When I am anxious in the grip of an emotion, the characteristic look or air of this same emotion tends to relieve my anxiety, tends to come as a sight for sore eyes, whether the look or air in question is a temporary possession deriving from me or a permanent possession independent of me. In the first case, the relief from anxiety is itself temporary; in the second case it is more permanent, with the result that when I am in a melancholy state, I may actively seek out things with a durably melancholy look or air to them for the durable relief they stand ready to provide. Whenever I encounter the look or air of melancholy I respond affectively in some of the ways I would to the melancholy presence of a melancholy person, and this response of ours often seems charged with or evocative of memories of past situations where melancholy and its management were an issue for me; indeed, some such more or less memory-laden affective response seems to be part of what it takes to experience the look or air in question. Finally, memories of having experienced relief at the hands of something durably possessing a look or air of melancholy tend to reinforce and stabilize our experience of the thing in question as durably possessing this look or air in question in the first place, much as memories of a recent injury to a particular part of my body can reinforce and stabilize my experience of that part of my body as hurting or in pain.
If we have independent reason to believe there is such a defense mechanism as complex projection, then one possible and economical explanation of these data would be as follows:
© When something possesses a look or air of melancholy temporarily, unstably, and only for me, I am experiencing my projection onto it of my own melancholy.
(d) When something durably and impersonally possesses this same look or air (under particular circumstances), one is experiencing that thing’s readiness to stably sustain the projection of melancholy (under such circumstances);
where © constitutes an answer to (a) and (d) an answer to (b). This line of thought assigns our experiences of melancholy looks and airs precisely the contents Wollheim’s theory assigns them, without needing to establish anything about the origin of these experiences first.
Budd mounts various other objections to Wollheim’s account as well; replies to some of them are implicit in what I’ve said already. He thinks assigning a role to affect in our experience of expressive properties in art conflicts with Wollheim’s sensible acknowledgement that we can find a work of art expressive of melancholy without feeling melancholy ourselves. He suggests that Wollheim give up accounting for melancholy in art and content himself with an account of melancholy in nature. Yet the required affect needn’t be melancholy itself experienced by the subject here and now; it may be remembered melancholy experienced in the past, a resisted felt tendency to feel melancholy here and now, or a mixture of the two. Budd wants a positive account of why experiences of correspondence must involve affect at all. This is like asking why color experiences must involve visual sensations, or why experiences of fragility must involve a felt edginess, rooted in our own protective impulses. If Wollheim is right about its content, an experience of correspondence is a particular objective condition (a readiness to stably accommodate the projection of a particular feeling) making itself felt in a particular subjective manner (involving past and present affect). Finally, Budd wants some indication of why some things are more ready than others to accommodate the projection of particular feelings. This is a perfectly fair demand, and one Wollheim should do more to meet. Let me speculate for a minute in his behalf.
In a famous episode from Book I of the Prelude, the youthful Wordsworth is out walking one fine summer evening and happens on a boat, tied to a tree at the side of a lake. He takes her out for a furtive joyride:
Straight I unloosed her chain, and stepping in
Pushed from the shore. It was an act of stealth
And troubled pleasure, nor without the voice
Of mountain-echoes did my boat move on;
Leaving behind her still, on either side,
Small circles glittering idly in the moon,
Until they melted all into one track
Of sparkling light. But now, like one who rows,
Proud of his skill, to reach a chosen point
With an unswerving line, I fixed my view
Upon the summit of a craggy ridge,
The horizon’s uttermost boundary, for above
Was nothing but the stars and the grey sky.
She was an elfin pinnacle; lustily
I dipped my oars into the silent lake,
And, as I rose upon the stroke, my boat
Went heaving through the water like a swan;
When, from behind that craggy steep till then
The horizon’s bound, a huge peak, bleak and huge,
As if with voluntary power instinct
Upreared its head. I struck and struck again,
And growing still in stature the grim shape
Towered up between me and the stars, and still,
For so it seemed, with purpose of its own
And measured motion like a living thing,
Strode after me. With trembling oars I turned,
And through the silent water stole my way
Back to the covert of the willow tree;
There in the mooring-place I left my bark, —
And through the meadows homeward went, in grave
And serious mood; but after I had seen
That spectacle, for many days, my brain
Worked with a dim and undetermined sense
Of unknown modes of being; o’er my thoughts
There hung a darkness, call it solitude
Or blank desertion. No familiar shapes
Remained, no pleasant images of trees,
Of sea or sky, no colors of green fields;
But huge and mighty forms, that do not live
Like living men, moved slowly through the mind
By day, and were a trouble to my dreams.
Suppose the boy’s petty thievery inspires in him a feeling of accusatory sternness, a sternness which makes him anxious and keeps him anxious as long as he experiences this sternness as his own judgment on his own conduct. Anxiety abates if he can imaginatively convert his feeling of sternness into an air of sternness worn by a portion of his external surroundings, thereby making him safe from it and it safe from him. It turns out he can do precisely this: the craggy steep looming up behind the hills on the shore he’s rowing away from turns out to stably accommodate the projection of felt sternness. And this projection has an enduring, troubling, morally potent side-effect: now every craggy steep wears a look or air of accusatory sternness and gets responded to (up to a point) as if it were a stern and accusatory person, regardless of the boy’s feelings and conduct at the time. Asked for an account of the special affinity between a craggy steep by the side of a lake and sternness, the affinity which makes a cliff like this an accommodating home for projected sternness, we can cite the cliff’s rough and unrelieved surface; the moonlit brightness that makes it dominate its visual surroundings; the way it looms up higher (in relation to the nearby hills in front of it) as the rower flees from it across the lake.
Rob van Gerwen wants to resist theories like Wollheim’s on which representation and expression involve categorically different kinds of meaning or content. He allows that certain familiar phenomena suggest a categorical difference, even an “opposition,” between representation and expression. A work can represent happiness while expressing desolation: think of a desolate painting of a happy gathering. Despite all this, van Gerwen thinks expression can be analyzed as a special case of representation once we grant him two assumptions. The first is a broadly subtractive account of how representation works: the experience we have in the presence of a representation is a toned-down, thinned-out, aim-inhibited version of an experience we’d typically have in the actual presence of its subject. The second is an empathy-based account of how we detect and characterize the emotions of others: using cues in their outward behavior as a guide, we re-enact their emotions in a toned-down, thinned-out, aim-inhibited manner; then we detect and characterize our own reenactments by introspection. Ordinary visual properties in our surroundings are available to us via one “sense modality,” namely vision, and emotions in our surroundings are available to us via a second “sense modality” implicating vision in some of its operations, call it empathy. Expression, then, is what becomes of representation when:
(a) the represented items are experiential events such as emotions, and
(b) the “sense modality” offering the relevant toned-down, thinned-out counterparts of full-fledged firsthand experience is empathetic reenactment.
When the “sense modality” employed by representation is empathy instead of one of the five bodily senses, the result is what we know as expression.
If this is what van Gerwen has in mind, his account of representation inherits many of the difficulties confronting an older and more famous subtractive account, the one Plato offered in the Republic. Besides, it’s unclear how empathy as such can enable us to perceive a painting’s melancholy, since when we look at a melancholy painting, there isn’t any melancholy emotion out there in the painting for empathy to re-enact. The only kind of expression empathy as such enables us to understand is the expression of an emotion actually had in the observable conduct of someone who actually has it. Even if we bracket these difficulties, van Gerwen seems committed to saying that in the case he started with, one and the same thing, the desolate painting of the happy gathering, presents an impression of happiness to one sense modality (vision) and an impression of desolation to another sense modality (empathy). Why isn’t this a conflict between the deliverances of distinct sense modalities, on all fours with the stick that looks bent but feels straight?
Graham McFee is sympathetic to Wollheim’s effort in Art and its Objects to characterize art as a form of life and to his brief remarks in that early book about how we can defend attributions of particular expressive properties to particular works. But he is impatient with what he views as excessive biographical commitments in retrievalism and excessive psychoanalytic commitments in the theory of projective properties. He therefore aspires to give “a Wittgensteinian dissolution of the problem of artistic expressiveness” (159). The dissolution proceeds more or less as follows.
Various philosophers have urged that a good way to represent a human rational capacity is to articulate a body of propositional knowledge such that the possession and effective deployment of this knowledge suffices to bestow the capacity in question on anyone with a full normal range of human pre-rational capacities. Chomsky-style theories of grammaticality and Davidson-style theories of truth conditions are often presented as “theoretical representations of rational abilities” in precisely this Dummettian sense. Suppose we had a complete account of how attributions of melancholy and the like to works of art can be supported and undermined by other property attributions (and of how attributions of melancholy and the like can in turn be used to support or undermine further judgments and evaluations of a broadly aesthetic kind). We’d then have a theoretical representation of the practical ability to ascribe expressive properties, and it would be as full an account of what that ability consists in as we could want for purely philosophical purposes. Remaining questions about how it is actually implemented in human beings who lack the relevant propositional knowledge can sensibly be deemed merely psychological.
That such an account can be given in principle for talk of melancholy and the like in art, even if it can’t be given for talk of melancholy and the like in uncontrived physical nature, is suggested to McFee by two considerations:
(a) We can argue to good effect about whether or not a given work is melancholy, even if we can’t do so about whether a given natural scene is. To possess a shared sense of what counts as a pertinent observation in such arguments, we must share a tacit commitment to principles telling us which other properties make for melancholy and which other properties tend to preclude it. (Such principles would be “principles of criticism” in Hume’s sense.)
(b) Even if we refuse to deem a spectator’s ability to detect melancholy a rational ability subject to theoretical representation, we should grant this status to a painter’s ability to determine whether his work will or won’t exhibit melancholy in the first place. Expression in art is a kind of deliberately meaningful “gesture” (158), and the ability to perform such gestures is a form of know-how, representable as a body of principles which point out effective means to a given end. (Such principles would be “rules of art” in Hume’s sense.)
An account of the place of attributions of expressive properties in what Sellars calls “the space of reasons” would therefore be a philosophically complete account of what these properties come to. And such an account is in principle available, without any effort to identify the psychological mechanisms at work in the perception of such properties. Claims about what makes for or tends to preclude melancholy in art, claims which figure for audiences as principles of criticism and for artists as rules of art, are the only theory we need in this area.
To de-psychologize a philosophical problem isn’t yet to dissolve it. As the examples of Chomsky and Davidson and well-written how-to manuals remind us, giving a compact and perspicuous theoretical representation of a rational capacity often requires a large, ingenious, contestable piece of positive theorizing. But McFee holds that since the principles in terms of which we are explicating the ability to produce and recognize expressive properties are just particular truths concerning what makes for or tends to preclude melancholy and the like in painting, it should be enough for all philosophical purposes if these principles surface piecemeal, one at a time, as we articulate and assess individual critical arguments in the framework of “reflective commonsense” (161). In slogans: first we must see that principles of criticism are all we need in the way of philosophical theory; then we must see that