Edwin Curley (ed., tr.)

The Collected Works of Spinoza, Volume II

Edwin Curley (ed., tr.), The Collected Works of Spinoza, Volume II, Princeton University Press, 2016, 769 pp., $ 55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691167633.

Reviewed by Piet Steenbakkers, Utrecht University

It requires scholars with a daunting range of specializations and skills to translate the works of Spinoza: an excellent command of the target language as well as of Latin, Dutch and Hebrew; familiarity with scholarly literature written in different languages, not only on Spinoza’s philosophy but also on textual criticism, biblical scholarship and many facets of history. Very few people are competent in all these areas, and Edwin Curley is among them. A reputed philosopher, with publications on Spinoza, Hobbes, Descartes, religion and ethics, he is also an erudite historian equipped with the required linguistic expertise. He has been working on Spinoza since 1963, and is well at home in international scholarship, to which he himself has made significant contributions. Curley began translating Spinoza’s oeuvre back in 1969. The first volume of The Collected Works of Spinoza was published by Princeton University Press in 1985. It contains the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect (henceforth TIE, the acronym of its Latin title), the Short Treatise (KV, from the Dutch ‘Korte Verhandeling’), Spinoza’s adaptation of Descartes’s Principles of Philosophy and its appendix Metaphysical Thoughts, the Ethics, and the correspondence up to 1663. In the summer of 2016, the long-awaited second volume came out, with the rest of the correspondence and the two political works: the Theological-Political Treatise (TTP) and the Political Treatise (TP). Both volumes contain introductions, extensive annotations, a glossary, indexes and a bibliography. Curley’s erudition is manifest throughout; his perceptive studies on different aspects of Spinoza’s philosophy (metaphysics, ethics, politics, religion, Bible criticism) feed into the impressive scholarly apparatus of The Collected Works, notably the annotations and glossaries.


The long gestation of this project gave rise to murmurs and comments. As Curley notes with a fine sense of understatement: ‘Some expressed a certain impatience for the completion of Volume II’ (p. x). It is here now, and the result is a resounding success. If the protracted period elicited impatience, it also affected the result — on the whole, beneficially. Curley generously shared his drafts with colleagues, circulating successive versions of (especially) the TTP — a practice that gave rise to fertile exchanges that contributed to the final result. Thus, the second volume profited from Curley’s own maturation as well as from the rising tide of international Spinoza scholarship in the past decades.

Inevitably, there are drawbacks as well. Curley made choices in the first volume, in particular with regard to the preferred text edition, that were difficult to adjust afterwards. This will be explained in more detail below. In addition, the long duration has resulted in some minor flaws. Thus, there are inconsistencies and obscurities in the references and bibliography. An example is the wavering between DC and DCv as siglum for Hobbes’s De Cive (inviting confusion with De Corpore): both occur throughout the volume, occasionally even together (p. 556, n. 43). More seriously, basic information for the reader is located in different places. It requires some inventiveness and determination to figure out the meaning of certain sigla and codes. The capital ‘A’ may mean axiom (p. xx); or it may refer to Fokke Akkerman’s Dutch translation of the TTP (p. 725); or again it may indicate an autograph letter as the source of a variant reading (e.g. p. 18; explained on p. 7). Likewise, ‘C’ stands for corollary; or for copy (of a letter; used on p. 32; not explained, but to be inferred from a remark on p. 8) — unless the letter was copied by Leibniz, in which case the siglum is LC (p. 369); not to be confused with LCL, Loeb Classical Library (p. 751). Editors and translators are often denoted with acronyms (MBG = Spinoza, Premiers écrits, ed. Mignini, trans. Beyssade, Ganault), which are also employed for titles of works, books, series and collections (RT = De Rechtzinnige Theologant, DLD = Database of Latin Dictionaries). The practice itself is conventional and convenient enough, but often the reader has no clue where to look for the solutions, dispersed as they are among the different sections of the bibliography, or hidden in other parts of the book like the introductions to the particular works. The acronym JPS is nowhere explained; there is an entry NJPS in the section ‘Biblical and Talmudic Materials’ of the bibliography: the new Tanakh translation of the Jewish Publication Society, usually referred to in the notes as NJPS, but also as ‘New JPS’ (p. 132) and ‘the more recent JPS’ (p. 104).

The reader must also hunt to discover the import of some typographical devices that Curley uses to fine-tune semantic niceties. When ‘power’ translates the Latin potestas rather than potentia, it is marked thus: ‘power. (Curley calls the mark a prime: pp. 638, 650; or a single quote mark: p. 69, but it is in fact the straight apostrophe featuring on old typewriters.) A similar distinction applies to ’knowledge’: when marked (‘knowledge) it renders scientia, otherwise cognitio. The explanations are to be found in the Glossary, on pp. 650 and 637 — 638 respectively. For ’power, there is reference to the Glossary on p. 69 (n. 21). But a reader who overlooks that note will be at a loss. Another distinction is applied to the conjunction ’or’: when this translates Latin sive or seu (rather than vel, aut or enclitic ‑ve), it is italicized. Curley did likewise in Volume I, explaining the reason in the General Preface (p. vx). In Volume II, there is an extensive discussion and justification of this distinction on pp. 610-612, expressing the ‘hope that this edition will advance a discussion’ on ’Spinoza’s many uses of sive’ (p. 612). That is a laudable aim, but it overlooks the reader who needs this information in order to interpret the translation correctly: how many people will search in the preface to the Glossary for an explanation of a typographical variant? (In passing it may be remarked that the phrase Deus seu Natura occurs not only in the preface to Ethics 4, as Curley says on p. 612, but also twice in Ethics 4, prop. 4, dem., and — in inverted order — in KV, appendix II, §4.)

It seems, then, that either the long gestation or the sizeable proportions of the book, or both, did have some effects on its manageability and accessibility. That being said, I am not enthusiastic about these typographical devices for another reason. Curley’s translations are quoted by very many students and scholars, including myself. For me, these marks are an embarrassment: if I include them when quoting, they need an explanation; if I leave them out, I must add a qualification like ‘translation modified’. In normal academic use, translations should be able to stand on their own, without such caveats.


From the beginning, Curley has presented his project as a translation of Spinoza’s collected works, which is not the same as the complete works. In the General Preface to the present volume (p. xvii), he explains why he did not include Spinoza’s Hebrew grammar or the apocryphal treatises on the rainbow and on the calculation of chances. The author of the two scientific treatises was Salomon Dierquens: they had been attributed rashly and on false grounds to Spinoza in the nineteenth century (not first by Gebhardt, as is stated on p. xvii), so Curley is absolutely right in not including them. The Hebrew grammar, however, is something different: Spinoza’s authorship is beyond doubt, and there is no good reason to leave it out when compiling a scholarly edition of an otherwise complete oeuvre. Curley now considers revising Volume I, and wants to use that as an opportunity to add portions of the grammar. He deems a complete translation unnecessary (p. xvii). He may be quite right about the limited philosophical importance of conjugations of Hebrew verbs, yet in an enterprise of this scope readers are entitled to ‘the works’, literally. It would be a good idea to include the Hebrew grammar lock, stock, and barrel.

Curley offers a more extended selection than usual from the epistolary treatise by Jarig Jelles now classified as Letter 48a. The inclusion of Stensen’s pseudo-letter 67bis, which was never dispatched nor even directed to Spinoza, can be defended on formal grounds. It could have done with more annotation, as it was part and parcel of a more extended exercise in self-criticism with which the convert Stensen abjured modern philosophy and science, so as to ingratiate himself with the Roman Catholic Church. The letter hardly bears on Spinoza’s philosophical views, of which Stensen knew little.

In some collections of Spinoza’s works, especially in German editions and translations, it has been customary to include several stock biographical texts (Colerus, Lucas, Bayle). Given the amount of material now available, and the generally poor quality of the early biographical documents, that tradition is no longer commendable. There is one additional text, though, that would merit being translated: the preface to the 1677 editions of Spinoza’s posthumous works. The Dutch original was written by Jarig Jelles for De Nagelate Schriften and translated into Latin by Lodewijk Meyer for the Opera Posthuma. It is a long and meandering text, and not all of it bears on Spinoza’s works; yet it is closely tied to the works published by Spinoza’s friends after his demise. As yet no English translation of this important document is available, and I am sure it will be highly appreciated if Curley were to incorporate it in an update.

Chronological arrangement

One of Curley’s initial choices was to present the works chronologically, after the model of Alquié’s edition of the works of Descartes (Volume I, p. xiii, n. 7). There is a lot to be said in favor of that arrangement, but it has liabilities, too. We do not know the dates of all the works, nor even their relative order, let alone the exact chronology of the letters. Stensen’s letter 67bis, for example, is always dated 1675, the year of its publication, but its content shows that it must originally have been written in 1671 or 1672. One consequence of the chronological arrangement is that the correspondence is cut up in four portions and divided over the two volumes. This break-up makes it more difficult for readers to locate a letter. In fact the chronological turn in the presentation of Spinoza’s letters started a long time ago, when Van Vloten and Land decided to do away with the thematic presentation (by correspondent) we find in the posthumous works, and to renumber all the letters in chronological order. That was, on the whole, not such a good idea, and I find the splitting into portions an unfortunate next step. Nor do I see how it helps to bring out Spinoza’s philosophical development over the years (the aim of the rearrangement, as stated in the General Preface to Volume I, pp. xii-xiii).


Many French, German and Italian translations of Spinoza’s works are bilingual: the original Latin (and in some cases Dutch) source text is presented on the page facing the translation. So far, there is only one bilingual edition that offers Latin and English, viz. Wernham’s Political Works of 1958 (the TTP in full with selections from the TP). The appendix of Wienpahl’s book The Radical Spinoza (New York University Press, 1979), which contains the definitions, axioms, postulates and propositions in English and Latin, may be counted as such, too, although it is a bit of curiosity. Curley offers translations only, but he does pay a lot of attention to the transmission and constitution of the source texts. This results in a number of emendations and conjectures, so that what we get in the end is, in a sense, not just a translation but also a new edition, even if that materializes only in translated variant readings and annotations.

Curley’s judicious treatment of textual matters is one of the assets of the Collected Works, and one of the reasons it is indispensable for scholars, whether Anglophone or not. Volume II continues the initial policy of the project of taking the 1925 Gehbardt edition (Spinoza Opera, four volumes) as its default source text (p. xvi). That choice was the most obvious one when Curley was working on Volume I, that is to say up to the early 1980s, but since then the situation has changed. From Akkerman’s dissertation of 1980 onwards, textual scholarship has shown the shortcomings of the Gebhardt edition and worked on a new one. Curley notes, rightly, that there is as yet no complete edition that can replace Gebhardt. In the series Spinoza Œuvres (Presses Universitaires de France, Paris), three volumes have so far appeared: TTP (1999, edited by Akkerman, translated by Moreau and Lagrée), TP (2005, ed. Proietti, trans. Ramond), KV and TIE (2009, ed. Mignini, trans. Beyssade and Ganault). The edition of the Ethics (ed. Akkerman and myself, trans. Moreau) has recently been finished and is now being prepared for the press.

Fortunately, Curley was able to take into account much recent editorial work. In many places he discusses the textual problems involved. He does not hesitate to adopt a reading different from Gebhardt’s when he is convinced of its appropriateness. For any change in the text the grounds are given in the notes. In most cases the textual criticism is solid and clear, with a few inaccuracies (e.g. p. 276, n. 12: ‘4:14’ is a misprint in some of the seventeenth-century editions of the TTP, but not in the first edition T1, which reads ‘34:14’; p. 302, n. 18: not a silent correction of ALM, but the reading of their source text, T1). Sometimes more information would have been useful: the reader cannot always infer what is at stake (e.g. the words struck through in n. 76, p. 408; or the blend of readings discussed in n. 37, p. 586).

In the correspondence Gebhardt’s edition also plays a guiding role, but in practice Curley selects a single source text for each letter: Opera Posthuma, Nagelate Schriften, autograph, copy or otherwise. This is an excellent approach: every letter has its own history and should be edited individually.

The predominance of Gebhardt’s model, then, is in part neutralized in the constitution of the texts. In the presentation, however, its presence is formidable. In his English translation, Curley retains the rather random capitalization that Gebhardt copied from seventeenth-century printing conventions (not always faithfully: thus Decalogue on p. 276, l. 8, has a capital in Gebhardt but not in the original 1670 edition). Spinoza himself used considerably fewer capitals and was far from consistent. For modern readers, these capitals are distracting in that they lend emphasis or pompousness to words, for example in a sentence like this: ‘As far as I can see from your Last Letter, the Appearance of the Book you intended for publication is in danger’ (Letter 71, p. 464). A more serious issue is that Gebhardt’s page and line numbers are used throughout for reference  They appear in the margins of both volumes and in the cross-references, indexes and glossaries — whereas readers should be directed to the appropriate pages of the book they have before them. It would have considerably improved the usefulness of the two volumes if they had been equipped with their own line numbers throughout.


In the General Preface to Volume II, Curley reflects critically upon the readability of the first volume (p. x), partly in response to criticism from Jonathan Bennett: ‘In this volume I have tried very hard to make sure that my translations are as readable as I can make them without sacrificing my other goals.’ (The goals he has in mind here are, I presume, in particular accuracy and consistency: see p. ix.) The result is indeed very readable: the language is direct and simple, sentences are usually short, with longer periods broken up, convoluted constructions are avoided, enumerations have been cut up and arranged in numbered lists. Not that the language was so much less accessible in Volume I, but now readability has become a matter of principle. There is some missionary zeal in this: Curley here follows the precepts formulated by Bennett (http://www.earlymoderntexts.com/faqs/how). And it works: many readers will be grateful for Curley’s supple phrasing and almost casual tone — quite a feat, given the difficulty of the texts presented here. But it comes at a price. The translation’s register (in the linguistic sense) differs considerably from what we find in Spinoza’s works, which are carefully constructed according to rhetorical principles. Curley is right in declaring that it is philosophy he translates, not literature (p. xiii), but that is not at issue. Between Spinoza’s works, and even within the same work, the tone can vary considerably. Thus, the TTP is often passionate in its attempts to persuade an audience, whereas the TP is a detached and rather dry analysis. The same goes for the correspondence: Spinoza adapts his style and tone to the person he addresses. Such varieties are always difficult to bring across in translation, and the emphasis on readability tends to smooth them out altogether, turning Spinoza into an approachable fellow. An element that strikes me as unduly colloquial is the marked preference for contracted forms (we’ve, he’d, you’ll, what’s, don’t).

On the other hand, the readability (and quotability!) of the text is affected by several editorial choices: the decision to reproduce the rather random capitalization of words found in Gebhardt’s edition, the use of typographically marked vocables, the insertion between brackets of additions, cross-references, clarifications and occasionally also of variant readings. Another potential hindrance, to which we shall now turn, is the splitting of paragraphs and the introduction of lists.

Presentation, arrangement

More than a century ago, the Dutch poet and classical scholar Jan Hendrik Leopold formulated the basic requirements for a truly modern critical edition of Spinoza’s works. Among them was a division into numbered paragraphs, deemed essential for study purposes. Leopold cites as an example the numbered sections introduced by Bruder in his Opera edition of 1843-1846. Many editions and translations have adopted Bruder’s numbering of the TIE, and Curley does the same for the TTP. He finds the paragraphs as proposed in Akkerman’s recent edition of that text too long. A concordance of the Bruder and Akkerman numberings is given on pp. 767-769. It is a pity that we now have two competing systems, each backed up by an authority, but I can understand Curley’s reservations. One wonders, however, why he stopped here. Several sections in the TP are long enough to be cut up as well, and the same goes for the paragraph division of the letters. With regard to the correspondence, Curley’s policy is baffling. Some of the letters are divided into numbered paragraphs, apparently following Akkerman’s Dutch translation of 1977. The numbering stops halfway in letters 42 and 67 (onwards from pp. 382 and 448 respectively) and it follows a different model (not Akkerman’s) in letter 67bis. The numbers are wholly absent from the first batch of letters (29-41) and again from letters 43-47, 50-66, and 68-84.

On principle, Curley sets apart lists and enumerations by splitting, indenting and numbering (usually with Roman numerals; once with Arabic numerals: p. 587). While this can be helpful, it is also a drastic intervention in the layout of the text. The blank lines disturb the page and the lists seem to suggest a textbook (for instance on pp. 266 -270, 323-329, 586-587). Here, too, didactic considerations such as readability and transparency at times confound the tight rhetorical structure of the original texts.

Editorial aids

One of the most valuable features of this book is its Glossary: sixty fascinating pages of thoughtful scholarship, a treasure trove for anyone interested in Spinoza, or in philosophy and translation, for that matter. It is complemented by a Latin-Dutch-English Index. Curley started working on the Glossary in order to ensure consistency in the technical vocabulary (see pp. 607-608), and he has succeeded remarkably well. Unfortunately, the Index is not so easy to use, as the references are not to page and line numbers of the book at hand, but to volume and page numbers of Gebhardt (as given in the margins). This is a cumbersome procedure. When it comes to individual words and concepts, the lack of line numbers is off-putting.

The bibliography of Works Cited testifies to Curley’s erudition and experience. It is, however, not easy to consult if one starts from the references in the book. The bibliography is divided into three sections (Editions of Spinoza’s Works, Biblical and Talmudic Materials, Other Works), so the reader who wants to look up a reference must already have an idea where to look for it, the more so because the location is not always evident. One point of criticism as regards the selection: scholars should not use the ubiquitous third printing (1914) of the Opera edition of Van Vloten and Land; it contains so many misprints that it ought to be avoided altogether. The only authoritative version is the first edition of 1882-1883, nowadays available online.


In English, there are three translations of collections of Spinoza’s works. R.H.M. Elwes’s two-volume set of The Chief Works of Benedict de Spinoza (1883-1884, revised 1887) contains TTP, TP, TIE, Ethics and parts of the correspondence. Though it is by now completely outdated, it regrettably continues to be widely used and reproduced (in print as well as online), simply because it is out of copyright. Samuel Shirley’s translations (supplemented with Wolf’s 1910 rendering of the KV and Bloom’s 1964 version of the Hebrew grammar) have been collected in the one-volume Spinoza Complete Works (Hackett, 2002). Its assets are that it is complete, and that Shirley’s English is elegant and attractive. The translation is, however, rather free (for an illustration see the examples Curley gives on pp. 607-608), which makes it less suitable to serve as a scholarly tool. Provided with helpful explanatory and interpretive notes, the Hackett edition aims at a general readership. Edwin Curley’s two-volume Collected Works of Spinoza, though not (yet) covering the complete works, strives for a consistent philosophical vocabulary as well as for a transparent presentation, takes into account a vast range of philosophical, historical and textual scholarship, offers an abundance of sagacious notes and comes with very helpful tools (glossary, terminological index) and bibliography. It is the first choice for scholarly purposes and for teaching. Not only as a set, but also on the level of the individual works, Curley’s renderings are at present the best Spinoza translations available to the English reader. It is therefore to be hoped that Princeton will eventually also bring out separate paperback editions of all the single works.