2017.12.04

Paul Moser

The God Relationship: The Ethics for Inquiry about the Divine

Paul Moser, The God Relationship: The Ethics for Inquiry about the Divine, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 347 pp., $99.99, (hbk), ISBN 9781107195349.

Reviewed by Trent Dougherty, Baylor University


According to Paul Moser, almost no one has explored either what consequences a relationship with God has for human inquiry about God or the claim that we can empower or block God's self-manifesting evidence. The existential and the ethical, says Moser, are of little concern to contemporary religious scholars. It is Moser's intention to correct this supposed neglect by explaining in detail how God seeks to be known in human trial by those willing to cooperate with him.

Chapters one and two recapitulate much of Moser's previous work. The Christian God, unlike the god of deism, says Moser, seeks a personal relationship with human beings, primarily characterized by cooperation, mercy, empathy, and compassion (7). These are largely missing in most peoples' present lives; hence, a relationship with God is curative of the human condition. This means that inquiry about the divine must be informed by ethical constraints in virtue of God's curative aims. Accordingly, proper faith is responsive and intentional, not "merely reflective or emotional" (113). Rather, faith draws one into moral reflection in the light of God's perfect will (88). Faith cannot be reduced to belief but involves full cooperative self-entrustment to God, not just one's thoughts, feeling, or actions (70). According to Moser, inquiry that attends only to ideas or thoughts omits the appropriate motivating factors for communion with God, especially compassion (110). Consequently, Moser's normative standards for inquiry about God include inquirers' (1) self-reflective candor about their moral standing before God; (2) intending to conform sympathetically to God's morally perfect will upon receiving salient evidence of God's will; and (3) actively seeking evidence for God and God's perfect goodness (88). The challenge to seek God out in this way requires our willingness to be remade in the image of God (115).

Most of this seems right. However, when taken together it seems far too demanding a standard for nascent faith. What is absent from Moser's view is space for an imperfect process of gradually coming to faith in God over time, which is in fact the experience of many. It is as though Moser's only model for salvation is Paul's road to Damascus experience where "scales fell from his eyes." Moser often talks of faith in terms of Christ's Gethsemane struggle (75-83). But is perfect Christ-like allegiance to God required at the beginning of a life of faith or is it rather the result of such a life? Moser's view seems far more demanding than the patience expressed by Christ's prevenient call of his disciples, who at times fail in Gethsemane-like moments even while on the road of faith.

As in his previous works, Moser continues his charge against traditional natural theology. A main criticism is that traditional natural theology in principle tends only to inquiry into the divine with respect to thoughts and ideas. One wonders who Moser has in mind, and as with his previous works, he doesn't tell us. The main advocates of natural theology, both contemporary and historic, almost always embrace the kind of interpersonal transformative evidence Moser encourages us to consider more seriously.[1] Moser may be right that such transformative evidence is not the immediate focus of traditional natural theology. Still, Moser is wrong in thinking that most if not all natural theologians consider their project as ventured without an awareness of one's existential and ethical situation.

As this book is in a series focused on the nature of evidence for God -- and an attendant disdain for traditional theistic argumentation -- what he says about evidence is of central importance. Unfortunately, the chapter on evidence gets off to a bad start. He points out, quite correctly, that "The question of God's existence seems not to be conclusively settled, either pro or con, by sound deductive or inductive (including abductive) arguments for any sizeable group of people free of prior commitments on the question" (116, emphasis added). Again, this is surely true, but also surely utterly irrelevant. Are there any questions of much importance which would meet this standard? This mistake is baffling, since as far back as 1990 Alvin Plantinga (who receives no mention in the book) produced this mea culpa in the preface to the paperback edition of God and Other Minds: A Study of the Rational Justification of Belief in God. "I employed a traditional but improperly stringent standard; there may be plenty of good arguments for theism if there aren't any that start from propositions that compel assent from every honest and intelligent person and proceed majestically to their conclusion by way of forms of argument that can be rejected only on pain of irrationality" (x). Plantinga then draws the obvious conclusion parallel to ours above. "After all, no philosophical arguments of any consequence meet that standard, and the fact that theistic arguments don't is not as significant as I thought" (x). So, when Moser asks, immediately after the passage quoted above, "Could this indicate something important about the God in question?" (116), the answer must be a resounding, "No." This undercuts most of the subsequent material in the chapter.

Unfortunately, Moser continues to find significance in philosophical impasse. After mentioning one recent debate between a theist and an atheist, in which neither convinces the other, he concludes, "It suggests something is amiss in philosophical inquiry about God, and it recommends attention to the ethics for inquiry about God" (139). First, note that debate does not exhaust the modes of "inquiry about God," so the inference is already far too hasty. But, again, the relative rarity of advocates of philosophical positions to convince their doubting interlocutors is commonplace throughout every area of philosophy, even often in more formal matters. This may indeed have some skeptical consequences, as some in the literature on the epistemic significance of disagreement (none of which Moser cites) think, but there is no special problem here for philosophy of religion.

And when it comes to debates, Moser's criteria for success are overwrought. "When philosophical theists present arguments for God's existence to an audience, they should accept a rational burden: rationally to convince (some) previously uncommitted people who read or hear the arguments" (140). As so many people have pointed out, there are other reasons for giving arguments. They include (as in Aquinas) clarifying the nature of God, strengthening the faith of believers, and shaping culture by showing that belief is not irrational, stupid, or silly.

And Moser fails to understand that theistic arguments can be stepping stones. "If I had only the arguments in question, I would not be a theist, because the arguments fail to give us a God worthy of worship" (142). But, of course, the advocates of theistic arguments almost never aim to show any such thing. Rather, they seek to encourage further inquiry by showing that the kind of thing the God of their religion is -- a supernatural cause of the cosmos -- may well or probably exists. And Christian apologists don't just stop with theistic arguments; they go on to argue that the being plausibly shown to exist has reached out to humans with a revelation and in the life of Jesus Christ. It is through historical arguments that they move from "bare theism" to the God of Abraham, Isaac, and Jacob. So Moser criticizes arguments for not achieving a goal no one ever meant for them, and ignores the second half of the picture.

Chapters four and five contain much interesting and edifying material centered on various riffs on the central theme that we must seek God how he wants to be sought, a mode of inquiry flowing from the personal nature of his project. However, almost everything of interest is completely logically independent of anything he can claim any originality for and is, furthermore, perfectly amenable to evidentialists of all stripes, who Moser constantly excoriates. For example, the upshot of the penultimate chapter is that "Our affective and volitional set strays from what would be God's moral character, and this would obstruct our receiving good things from God, such as evidence, wisdom, purpose, and meaning" (254), and so he suggests that "inquirers make the effort to inquire responsibly about God . . . and thereby put themselves in a position to receive salient evidence and meaning from God" (255). This is wonderful advice. However, there is literally nothing in this that depends on any of the special developments of Moser. Compare Swinburne (who receives no mention in the book) in 1981 in a section on inquiry into the claims of religion:

[One] may come to have irrational beliefs either because he has devoted less time than he felt he ought to to these matters, or because he has refused to be led in the direction in which the evidence seems to point. In both these ways error may be culpable . . . Bodily desires may pull him back from pursuing what he sees as the long-term best goal. He must choose whether or not to yield to these desires. Thus he may choose whether to pursue salvation or whether to pursue temporary self-centered joys . . . (199)[2]

The idea that inquiry into the divine -- and this kind of inquiry is not alone in this regard -- is affected by one's character is commonplace, even among the most stalwart of evidentialists.

Specifically with respect to the effect of affect on evidence gathering, William Wainwright developed an evidentialist-friendly account of "passional reason" in 1995[3] (which harkens back to older work by George Mavrodes). This makes it a bit galling that Wainwright does not receive any mention in the book. Indeed, it seems to us that it is Wainwright, and not Moser, who did the ground-breaking work; it just has never received the attention it deserved.[4] So it is not so much that, as Moser repeatedly claims (in this book and all the other books in the series it completes), his predecessors have ignored these ideas, as that Moser has ignored his predecessors.

The book begins thusly:

Many religious people talk about their relationship with God [emphasis in original], but few people have explored the consequences of such talk for human inquiry about God . . . This book explores those consequences by introducing and developing a topic almost universally neglected [emphasis added] by inquirers about God: the ethics of inquiry for humans. It combines this topic with an equally neglected [i.e. "almost universally neglected"] position: the view that humans can choose either to empower or block God with regard to the option of God's self-manifesting in their salient, or definite, evidence (ix).

The claim of originality does not hold water. Moser is in fact saying little more than Christian apologist William Lane Craig, who avows that

The ultimate apologetic involves two relationships: your relationship with God and your relationship with others. These two relationships are distinguished by Jesus in His teaching on the duty of man.[5]

and also

Therefore, when a person refuses to come to Christ, it is never just because of lack of evidence or because of intellectual difficulties: at root, he refuses to come because he willingly ignores and rejects the drawing of God's Spirit on his heart. (47, see also 60)

Similarly, Moser:

As an intentional causal agent . . . God would be self-authenticating in being self-manifesting and self-witnessing . . . (132). The Spirit of God bears witness to the reality of God's love for us . . . This kind of interpersonal witness does not need an intervening speculative argument from philosophy. (212)

Craig:

We have already said that it is the Holy Spirit that gives us the ultimate assurance of Christianity's truth. Therefore, the only role left for reason to play is a subsidiary role…[6] [F]undamentally, the way we know Christianity to be true is by the self-authenticating witness of God's Holy-Spirit.[7]

Thus, the very core or Moser's book, the claim for which he makes constant claims of originality, is not at all original, and, ironically, often advanced by those he most decries: practitioners of traditional natural theology. One may disagree with Craig and Moser of course, but they remain on the same page and stand or fall together.

The essence of the book is the suggestion of an "ethics for inquiry about the divine." This seems to come to the following. Only those who have a certain degree of willingness to answer God's call to life transformation are fit to be given useful evidence for God or made capable of being able to understand the impact of the evidence they possess. This is because, as many Baptist sermons we've heard put it, God doesn't want people who just sit there believing that he exists, as even the devils believe God is there . . . and tremble (James 2:19). Rather, God calls people to lead morally upright lives of total obedience. Therefore, among the unwilling, belief in God, and the evidence that would bring it, are of no use for God. Pascal famously expressed this in many places, including the following:

Willing to appear openly to those who seek Him with all their heart, and to be hidden from those who flee from Him with all their heart, [God] so regulates the knowledge of Himself that He has given signs of Himself, visible to those who seek Him, and not to those who seek Him not. There is enough light for those who only desire to see, and enough obscurity for those who have a contrary disposition.[8]

With all its faults, Moser's insistence that we pay careful attention to the ethical aspects of divine inquiry is important and deserves more attention. But it is difficult to take Moser's charge against "speculative divine inquiry" seriously as he fails to engage either the relevant historical figures, such as Augustine, Anselm, Aquinas, and Pascal, or major contemporary figures like Plantinga and Swinburne. Surely, if the problem of "irresponsible" inquiry into the divine is as widespread as Moser repeatedly claims it is, then he should have no shortage of literature to critically engage. Such a book would have been much more helpful than this book turned out to be. Moser has shown considerable excellence as a philosopher in the past, and is capable of much more.

ACKNOWLEDGEMENT

Brandon Rickabaugh made substantive contributions to this review.


[1] See Trent Dougherty and Brandon Rickabaugh, “Natural Theology, Evidence, and Epistemic Humility,” European Journal for Philosophy of Religion 9 (2) (2017): 1-24; and Trent Dougherty, “Review of Paul Moser’s The Severity of God: Religion and Philosophy Reconceived,” Marginalia (February, 14, 2014).

[2] Faith and Reason, First Edition (Oxford University Press, 1981). 

[3] Reason and the Heart (Cornell University Press, 1995).

[4] For an update on his view, see VanArragon and Clark, Evidence and Religious Belief (Oxford University Press, 2011).For how it is consistent with evidentialism, see NDPR 2012.02.29.

[5] William Lane Craig, Apologetics: An Introduction (Moody Press, 1984), 207.

[6] Ibid., 21.

[7] Ibid., 18. 

[8] Blaise Pascal, Pensées, no. 430.