Paul Katsafanas's latest book complements his 2013 volume Agency and the Foundations of Ethics: Nietzschean Constitutivism (also published by Oxford) which offered illuminating exposition and criticism of constitutivist views in ethics developed by Christine Korsgaard and David Velleman, while defending the constitutivist project against trenchant critics like David Enoch and articulating a doctrine he called "Nietzschean constitutivism" centered around the rather incredible claim that the constitutive aim of all human action is overcoming resistances, which he suggested was what Nietzsche meant by "will to power." This new volume turns to questions of Nietzsche interpretation, leaving debates with contemporary constitutivists to one side. It also focuses generally on questions of moral psychology in Nietzsche's work, such as "reflection's role in action, the genuine action/mere behavior distinction, the nature of evaluative judgment, the structure of human motivation, the possibility of freedom, and the nature of responsibility" (5-6). Katsafanas also claims that Nietzsche "wants to understand how ethical claims are justified" (1), though no textual evidence is ever adduced anywhere in the book showing Nietzsche to be concerned with this question. Katsafanas's ambitious claim is that Nietzsche belongs among thinkers like Plato, Aristotle and Hume who "have a specification of human nature which feeds into an articulation of an ethical theory" (2) but that he eschews their "inadequate, morality-laden conceptions of human nature" (2). The book incorporates material from many previously published papers, though it reads as a sustained argument and not simply as a collection of papers.
In the first substantive chapter (Ch. 2), Katsafanas offers an account of Nietzsche's view of the unconscious, according to which "conscious mental states are those with conceptual content, whereas unconscious mental states are those with nonconceptual content" (46). Whereas most modern philosophers treat conscious mental states as of central importance to being human -- Katsafanas cites Kierkegaard's observation that, "The more consciousness, the more self; the more consciousness, the more will; the more will, the more self" (14) -- Nietzsche thinks consciousness "is intermittent, unimportant, dangerous, superficial, and falsifying" (14). Katsafanas offers plentiful textual evidence in support of this latter characterization.
He goes on to distinguish usefully between three ways of thinking about the unconscious, all of which share the idea that what is unconscious is "not introspectively accessible" (21). On what we might call the "Leibniz view," the unconscious states are too fine-grained "to be introspectively sensed" (21) (think of hearing the "crash" of a wave on the beach). On what we might call the "Herder view," unconscious thoughts are inaccessible because not linguistically articulated (20-21). Finally, on Freud's view, unconscious mental states are inaccessible because repressed (21) -- but note that this is compatible with them being conceptually articulated (a point to which we will return).
Katsafanas denies that conscious mental states are epiphenomenal on Nietzsche's view, only that consciousness as a "substantive faculty," one that "produces conscious thoughts ex nihilio" (21), is. The paradigm of the substantive faculty view is Descartes, and it is plausible that Nietzsche's polemics against "the Ego" seem directed against such a view. But Katsafanas also claims, without textual support, that "Nietzsche sometimes calls this faculty the Ego, and sometimes calls it Consciousness" (22). Katsafanas cites BGE 12 as supposed evidence that "there are legitimate ways to conceive of consciousness" (22) on Nietzsche's view, yet that passage never mentions consciousness, being concerned instead with the idea of the soul (die Seele).
To show that for Nietzsche all and only conscious mental states are necessarily conceptualized, Katsafanas relies on two passages: GS 354 which does seem to endorse the Herder view (e.g., Nietzsche writes that "the development of language and the development of consciousness . . . go hand in hand") and BGE 268 for the proposition that "[w]ords are acoustical signs for concepts." Katsafanas needs the latter because nothing in GS 354 claims that consciousness is conceptual (let alone uniquely conceptual), only that "conscious thinking [unlike the unconscious version] takes the form of words, which is to say signs of communication" (GS 354). Only if one supposed that conceptual content had to be linguistically articulated would one get Katsafanas's desired conclusion, but GS 354 pointedly does not say that. The BGE passage helps a bit except that it goes on to say, beyond what Katsafanas quotes, that "concepts . . . are more or less definite image signs [Bildzeichen] for often recurring and associated sensations, for groups of sensations" (BGE 268). That makes clear that concepts, on Nietzsche's view, do not depend on words, words being merely "acoustical" ways of representing concepts, while "image signs" actually are concepts. This would suggest Nietzsche is working with a familiar notion of concepts as "mental representations," a bit like "ideas" in the manner of Hume.
Alas, this mistake vitiates many of the book's arguments. That linguistic and conceptual articulation are different is, however, fortunate for Nietzsche, because if unconscious mental states were necessarily nonconceptual this would generate a host of problems, which Katsafanas recognizes but does not adequately resolve. For example, on the Leibniz view of the unconscious, perceptions can have determinate but non-articulable content, which, for Katsafanas, must be nonconceptual content. He introduces some suggestive textual evidence from Schopenhauer and Nietzsche that "unconscious" perceptions "involve a mere discriminatory ability" while "conscious ones . . . involve a classifying awareness that presents the perceived object as a token of some type" (34). But the unconscious perception must have a determinate non-conceptual content. Katsafanas usefully discusses contemporary views about nonconceptual content, but then, surprisingly, suggests that the account of nonconceptual content for "perceptual states" can be extended "to other kinds of mental states as well" (37), such as "believing" and "calculating" (38). No contemporary philosopher contemplates such an extension, since it is mysterious how such an account of human thinking and reasoning could work. Katsafanas appeals to what Schopenhauer calls "intuitive knowledge," which is really just a kind of know-how (the billiard player knows how to make his shot without knowing the "science of mechanics" as Schopenhauer puts it). Katsafanas claims this "displays a form of thinking and believing," but it is not plausible that Nietzsche's explanations of behavior in terms of unconscious motives can all be assimilated to "know-how."
This leads us to a second important difficulty with the claim that unconscious mental states are necessarily nonconceptual, namely, that much explanation in terms of the unconscious seems to clearly depend on the unconscious states having conceptual content. Katsafanas tries to respond to this objection (69-70), conceding that Freud's explanations of behavior in terms of unconscious mental states often turned on those states being conceptually articulated. But, Katsafanas says, many Freudian explanations are "highly contentious" (70). So are Nietzsche's, though Katsafanas is silent on that, and like Freud's, they have conceptually articulated content: e.g., the "sour grapes" mechanisms at work in the slave revolt in morality. Katsafanas also claims that if Freud-style explanations appeal to states with conceptual content, then "Nietzsche will label these states conscious" (70). That is not an argument, just a dogmatic reaffirmation of Katsafanas's mistake, one made without any textual evidence showing this to be Nietzsche's dogmatism.
Katsafanas considers only one alternative way of marking the conscious/unconscious distinction, defended most systematically by Riccardi (forthcoming). Riccardi argues that Nietzsche's view is a kind of "higher-order thought" (HOT) view, according to which, as Katsafanas glosses it, "an organism's mental state M is conscious iff the organism has a non-inferential higher-order representation with the content that it is in M" (41) (more colloquially, a mental state is conscious if one is aware of being in the state). All the mental states that figure in conscious deliberation (e.g., in exercising our will), for example, are conscious states and they are, Riccardi argues, epiphenomenal for Nietzsche, in the sense that their causal efficacy never depends on their being the targets of a HOT mental state. Katsafanas then tries to show (41-44) that an idiosyncratic version of a HOT theory can be rendered compatible with his thesis about how to demarcate the conscious and unconscious in terms of conceptualization.
Chapter 3 aims to explain why Nietzsche thinks consciousness is "superficial and falsifying" (48) within the framework of Chapter 2, but given Katsafanas's confusion between linguistic articulation and conceptual content, the crucial question is how much of Katsafanas's analysis can survive? The answer is some, but not much, since as Katsafanas admits, on his view "consciousness falsifies precisely because it is conceptual" (72). Sometimes the fact that consciousness is linguistically articulated will suffice to make some of Katsafanas's points: so, e.g., the central GS 354 passage supports the view that language falsifies, because it produces words that respond to the average person's experience and to social needs, and thus falsfies what the senses really deliver (cf. 50-52). But the framework of Chapter 2 forces Katsafanas to treat the problem of "falsification" exclusively in terms of the falsification of unconscious mental states by making them conscious through conceptualization, rather than falsification of phenomena in the world. He reduces Nietzsche's "perspectivism" to the claim that conscious experience is determined by our concepts but that, unlike Kant, Nietzsche recognizes these concepts are variable (53). He says, bizarrely, that all this is "relatively uncontroversial" (53). He discusses no texts here, perhaps because the main text about perspectivism (GM III:12) says nothing about conceptual relativity, but quite a lot about the relation between knowledge and affects. In an effort to show that the transformation of "bad conscience" into "guilt" in GM II is to be explained in terms of conceptualization, Katsafanas gives a strange account of the argument in GM II which assumes, without textual evidence, that bad conscience is unconscious, while guilty conscience is not (57-62) and is silent on the crucial puzzle in the Second Essay, namely, why atheism should not defeat the feeling of guilt (cf. Leiter 2015: 191-193).
Chapter 4, on the "Drives," is much more successful. "Nietzsche's principal explanatory token within psychology is the drive," notes Katsafanas (77), and the central challenge is to understand "drives" in a way that makes sense of Nietzsche's claim that "drives evaluate and interpret" (85). Katsafanas, refining and developing an idea first broached in Richardson (1996), argues that for Nietzsche, as for Schopenhauer, drives are "dispositions that induce affective orientations" (94): e.g., the sex drive, once activated, leads to arousal in the presence of sexually attractive persons. It is important for Nietzsche that drives "influence the content of . . . experience" (95) "by coloring our view of the world, by generating perceptual saliences, by influencing our emotions and other attitudes, by fostering desires" (97). And these "affectively charged, selective responses to the world . . . incline the agent to experience situations in evaluative terms" (98). Katsafanas offers fine examples of the preceding. He also makes effective use of Freud (himself clearly influenced by Nietzsche) to flesh out Nietzsche's account of drives (100-102). Drives, on this Nietzsche/Freud view, are "constant in the sense that they arise, with some regularity throughout the individual's life (100) and do not depend simply on "external stimuli (101). Drives also have both an aim and an object: the aim is the drive's "characteristic goal, in terms of which it is individuated from other drives" (101), while the "object" (to which "the drive itself is indifferent") is the entity on which the drive can find expression. (The aim of a man's sex drive is sexual orgasm; the object might be a particular woman or man.) Katsafanas also endorses the view of Anderson (2012) that drives "recruit" "affects" (104-106), though I was unclear how this squared with Katsafanas's central claim that drives are dispositions to have affective responses.
Chapter 5 goes on to offer an illuminating account of how drives relate to valuations. Katsafanas is admirable throughout the volume in engaging (mostly fairly) with the views of other scholars, and in Ch. 5, in particular, he draws intelligently, albeit critically, on interpretations developed by John Richardson, Peter Poellner, and Maudemarie Clark & David Dudrick. Against the overly intellectualized interpretations of some of the latter commentators, Katsafanas argues that for Nietzsche, an agent "values" some X "iff the agent (1) has a drive-induced positive affective orientation toward X, and (2) does not disapprove of this affective orientation" (120). The second condition is meant to allow for the fact that agents can, of course, experience some of their positive affective orientations as unwelcome, though finding them unwelcome can simply be the upshot of another drive. Moreover, as Katsafanas correctly argues, "a drive-induced affective orientation toward X" will lead "the agent's perceptions of X [to] typically be structured in a way that strongly inclines" the agent to think the judgment that X is valuable is warranted (131).
Surprisingly, in Chapter 6, Katsafanas tries to resist the apparent upshot of the preceding exegesis: after all, if "our actions are the products of a chaotic mix of largely non-conscious desires and drives" and "conscious thoughts are causally impotent," then the appearance that we "are capable of determining" our "actions via episodes of reflective, self-conscious choice" is "illusory" (135). Katsafanas proclaims his alternative to this natural reading of Nietzsche's view "far subtler" (136), though what this really means is that Nietzsche's texts must yield before the views Katsafanas thinks more plausible because less radical. Relying on a "minimal" account of willing -- an "agent self-consciously deliberates about whether to X, self-consciously decides to X, and then attempts to carry out the decision" (137) -- Katsafanas argues that prior to 1883, Nietzsche was both an "incompatibilist" (free will is incompatible with causal determination of the will) and an "eliminativist" about the will ("the will does not exist" ), but that afterwards he believed there was a will and he became a compatibilist. The texts do not support this tidy demarcation. Nietzsche's view both before and after 1883 was that what we experience as the will and willing is epiphenomenal, not that the will does not exist. Katsafanas's putative evidence that Nietzsche became a compatibilist consists in BGE 21, which he glosses as saying that "Nietzsche is attacking the assumption that willing requires absence of causal determination. He is rejecting incompatibilism" (140). But that is not what Nietzsche says; he says that the ideas of "free will" and "unfree will" are mythologies, involving "a misuse of cause and effect." One natural reading, nowhere noticed by Katsafanas, is that since what we experience as the "will" is epiphenomenal, the freedom or unfreedom of that "will" is irrelevant since that will makes no causal difference. The hard interpretive question, nowhere discussed by Katsafanas, is what the "misuse of cause and effect" means in this context.
Katsafanas notes that Nietzsche sometimes refers to "willing" in positive terms, for example, in the discussion of the "sovereign individual" (GM II:2) (140-142). Nietzsche clearly thinks that some people are capable of resisting temptations and holding "to a particular course of action" (141), but Katsafanas transmogrifies this into the claim that "Nietzsche's talk of resisting stimuli is most naturally construed as referring to a self-conscious capacity" (141). The texts do not support this, as Katsafanas presumably recognizes, but he argues that "every animal unreflectively resists certain stimuli: a bird that sees a tasty morsel of food will have an immediate urge to eat it, but will 'resist' that urge when it notices the cat lying in wait" (141), so in the case of the sovereign individual, this must be a matter of self-conscious activity. Katsafanas is silent on the fact that the "sovereign individual" is the culmination of "the task of breeding an animal [Tier] that is permitted to promise" (GM II:1). Surely some animals (e.g., some of the human ones) can become better than others at sticking to their commitments and resisting contrary incentives through good training.
Katsafanas frames the key issue as how Nietzsche can believe (as he clearly does [145-147]) that our "motives" (drives, affects) influence what passes as reflection, and yet at the same hold, according to Katsafanas, that "conscious deliberation is causally efficacious" in what an agent does (147). His evidence that conscious deliberation is causally efficacious (150-154) consists of passages in which Nietzsche notes that the interpretation attached to a drive influences its manifestation. But given that Katsafanas himself had earlier argued (correctly) that unconscious drives interpret (including interpreting other drives), I was surprised that he thought any of this showed that consciousness was efficacious. Throughout the discussion, Katsafanas confuses the question "do interpretations we are conscious of causally affect our motives?" with the question "is our being conscious of the interpretation what makes it causally effective on our motives?" A positive answer to the first is compatible with a negative answer to the second. When Katsafanas finally turns to a version of the second question (as articulated by Riccardi [154-155]), his attempt to defend an affirmative answer simply turns on the mistake from Chapter 2: he thinks that the causal role of any "interpretation" must be conscious since interpretations have conceptual content and a "conscious state . . . is a conceptualized state" (155). But since the latter is false, as a matter of Nietzsche interpretation (and, I think, philosophical plausibility), Katsafanas has no response to Riccardi's challenge.
In Chapter 7, Katsafanas argues against a widespread view in the secondary literature that what marks the "unity" of a self is a unity among that person's drives; his alternative -- which, in an annoying habit we have seen before, he pronounces a "more sophisticated" picture (165) -- is that Nietzsche follows Schiller in thinking that an "agent is unified when there is a harmonious relationship between the agent's reflective thought [or "self-conscious thought" (185)] and the agent's affects" (184) or "drives" (185). He ignores "[f]or the sake of brevity" (182 n. 23) Schiller's most important work, Letters on the Aethetic Education of Man, but I suspect the reason for ignoring it is different. For that seminal work gives an account of harmony entirely in terms of drives (Triebe), namely, the form drive (or reason) (Formtrieb), the sense drive (or sensibility) (sinnliche Trieb), and the play drive (Spieltrieb), the latter being essential to balancing reason and sensibility. Schiller's actual picture is precisely one of a unity of drives.
Chapter 8 argues, more plausibly, that Nietzsche "treat[s] unity of drives or activities as having instrumental, rather than intrinsic, value" (203). He also suggests that "the true self" is defined by "some form of independence in valuing" (220). The geniuses Nietzsche celebrates most -- Goethe, Napoleon, and Beethoven (cf. Leiter 2015: 92-100) -- "shift culture by instituting or promoting new values" (207), and do so with values that have "life-affirmative contents" (208). Less plausibly, he claims that Nietzsche, unlike Hume, thinks human nature is "fluid" and "malleable" (214), yet all the evidence adduced shows only that Nietzsche thinks the form in which drives express themselves is influenced by culture (his main examples involve the drive to cruelty, which appears to be part of the unfluid part of human nature!). This confused discussion concludes that, in fact, there are some "fixed aspects of human nature (217) after all!
Chapter 9 begins by making a compelling argument, following Rutherford (2011), that Nietzsche's "core conception of freedom is . . . the Spinozistic one" (231) according to which, as Rutherford puts it (quoted by Katsafanas), "freedom designates the mode of acting in which a thing is necessitated to act by its own nature . . . and not by the action of other things on it" (2011: 517). This is certainly a revisionary ideal of freedom, even more so when one realizes that on this Spinozistic view (which is also, I believe, Nietzsche's), "How and under what circumstances one is able to act from one's own power, is not up to one; it is fate" (Rutherford 2011: 533). That might seem to moot the utility of any philosophical arguments about how one ought to act. But Katsafanas can not shake his Kantian anxiety: he thinks that the only mode of value is the normative one of "constraint" (236-237) -- what about purely evaluative notions like "good" and "bad," or "noble" and "base"? -- and, even more surprisingly, he thinks that Nietzsche wants to explain the "normative authority" of values that an agent creates, even when those arise by "necessity" from his nature. Katsafanas's only textual evidence are passasges in which Nietzsche calls for a revaluation of values and has some rather definite standards for undertaking it (e.g., is the predominant morality conductive to human excellence?). What is missing is any evidence that Nietzsche is worried about justifying the supposed "normative authority" of these standards.
Katsafanas proposes to answer this non-Nietzschean question about "normative authority" by way of considering Hegel's critique of Kant's answer. This is a peculiar strategy, since we know that Nietzsche read little or no Hegel (who had fallen into disrepute in Germany by the 1850s), and learned about him mainly through other sources, mostly unfriendly (e.g., Schopenhauer). Katasafanas ends up admitting that it is a "profound difference" between Nietzsche and Hegel that the former has no interest in "immanent" critique (244-245). But he does claim that, "Nietzsche agrees with Hegel's claim that we do not justify norms by deriving them from some formal principle. This is why he mocks the attempt to provide a 'rational ground' for morality (BGE 186)" (243). But BGE 186 is not about Kant, but Schopenhauer, whose purportedly "rational" defense of morality has nothing to do with formal principles. There are many cases of carelessness and looseness with the texts in this volume, but this was one of the worst.
The preceding is prefatory to a reprise in Ch. 9 of a thesis from Katsafanas (2013), namely, that Nietzsche is a constitutivist in ethics, based on the claim that all action involves overcoming resistances, which is alleged to be Nietzsche's idea of "will to power." Huddleston (forthcoming) offers a devastating critique of that position, but says little about the interpretive issues. Interpretively, Katsafanas once again floats free of the textual evidence. Nietzsche undoubtedly thinks of power, in some sense, as valuable, but there is no evidence outside his unpublished notebooks that he thinks "revaluation is to be conducted in terms of will to power" as Katsafanas claims (246). Indeed, we know Nietzsche contemplated a systematic project like that, and then abandoned it. The idea that "willing power" means "perpetually seeking and overcoming resistances to one's ends" is adequate to some passages in Nietzsche's corpus (cf. Reginster 2006, whom Katsafanas follows on this reading of will to power) but not others (cf. Richardson 1996; Leiter 2015: 197 ff.). There is no clear support in Nietzsche's published works that "every action manifests will to power" (249), let alone for the constitutivist theory Katsafanas ascribes to him.
Chapter 10 sketches three competitors to the "Nietzschean moral psychology" articulated by Katsafansas, which he associates fairly with Kant, Hume, and Aristotle. His glosses of the comptetitors are sensible, and the supposed "Nietzschean" objections to them fairly predictable given the preceding chapters. Unsurprisingly, Katsafanas overstates Nietzsche's differences with Hume's moral psychology (271-274), precisely because, as we have seen, the "Nietzschean moral psychology" of this book is largely Katsafansas's invention, occasionally inspired by snippets from Nietzsche.
Katsafanas is a clear, intelligent and often philosophically astute writer, which makes it all the more remarkable that this book is so wrong so often about Nietzsche. A couple of the papers incorporated into this volume were important contributions to the scholarly literature. The book itself goes awry very early on, with the confusion about linguistic and conceptual content, which forces the author in to some strained and often misleading claims about the texts. Some of the other textual mischief is due to his commitment to the doctrine of "Nietzschean constitutivism" defended in his 2013 book. Here the author's motivation is easy to discern: he wants Nietzsche to answer his teacher Christine Korsgaard's question about "how ethical claims are justified" (1). That latter moralizing question was, of course, never Nietzsche's: Nietzsche viewed all such justifications in the history of philosophy as post-hoc rationalizations without intellectual merit. One of Nietzsche's "terrible truths" is precisely that ethical claims can not be justified, a "truth" Katsafanas plainly wants to resist throughout. His rendering of Nietzsche's "moral psychology" is really an attempt to construct a vaguely quasi-Nietzschean answer to Korsgaard's question about "normative authority."
I am grateful to Ken Gemes and Mattia Riccardi for helpful comments on the penultimate draft of this review.
References to Nietzsche's texts are by English acronym, chapter (Roman numeral) and section (Arabic numeral): The Gay Science (GS); Beyond Good and Evil (BGE); On the Genealogy of Morality (GM); Ecce Homo (EH).
Anderson, R. Lanier. 2012. "What is a Nietzschean Self?" in C. Janaway & S. Robertson (eds.), Nietzsche, Naturalism, and Normativity (Oxford University Press).
Gemes, Ken. Forthcoming. Review of Katsafanas, The Nietzschean Self, European Journal of Philosophy.
Huddleston, Andrew. Forthcoming. "Normativity and the Will to Power: Challenges for a Nietzschean Constitutivism," Journal of Nietzsche Studies.
Leiter, Brian. 2015. Nietzsche on Morality, 2nd edition (Routledge).
Reginster, Bernard, 2006. The Affirmation of Life (Harvard University Press).
Riccardi, Mattia. Forthcoming. "Nietzsche on the Superficiality of Consciousness, in M. Dries (ed.), Nietzsche on Consciousness and the Embodied Mind (de Gruyter).
Richardson, John. 1996. Nietzsche's System (Oxford University Press).
Rutherford, Donald. 2011. "Freedom as a Philosophical Ideal: Nietzsche and his Antecedents," Inquiry 54: 512-540.
 Of course, that Xs are Ys does not show that Ys are necessarily Xs! Katsafanas can cite only a Nachlass passage making the stronger claim.
Katsafanas returns to more of the passage at p. 37, but for a different purpose.
 He fails to note, however, that no defender of nonconceptual content thinks it is necessarily unconscious.
 In personal correspondence, Katsafanas makes clear that he has in mind accounts of subpersonal information-processing based on a causal theory of information, but even putting aside the interpretive question about whether this could be Nietzsche's view, it is still inadequate to account for the kind of rich forms of unconscious explanation that both Nietzsche and Freud deploy.
 Someone might dispute that know-how, in fact, involves unconscious "thinking and believing," but put that to one side.
Katsafanas also mentions (41) versions of the view in work by Tsarina Doyle and by me.
 Riccardi also thinks that there different kinds of mental states -- say, phenomenal versus reflective -- can be conscious in different ways: Nietzsche is, in his plausible rendering, a "pluralist."
 His reasons for saying that in 1878's Human, All-too-Human followed Schopenhauer, presupposing the nomic determinism of the phenomenal realm; his later reasons were different.
 Katsafanas even cites the relevant passages earlier, at p. 145.
 My thanks to Ken Gemes for guidance on Schiller's views. I think Katsafanas also misconstrues the essay by Schiller he focuses on, but for more on these issues, see Gemes (forthcoming).
 He follows other commentators in claiming that "Nietzsche usually treats selfhood as an honorific or aspirational" (200), though the texts from the published works cited do not support that.
 He quotes Kierkegaard's quip about Kant that Kantian self-legislation is "arbitrarily based upon the self itself" (236). He never considers that this is precisely Nietzsche's view, minus "arbitrarily"!