Peter van Inwagen's The Problem of Evil is a fairly short book, but only about half of it is devoted to his answer to the problem of evil. In the first chapter he discusses various senses of the term, "problem of evil"; not surprisingly, the problem of evil he will be addressing is the problem of answering the argument from evil, the argument, or rather arguments, against the existence of God based on the facts about evil. The second chapter is devoted to the idea of God; it turns out that van Inwagen accepts the views that in some circles are coming to be known as "open theism," though he does not himself use that term. The extremely interesting third chapter is devoted to philosophical failure; in it he contends that all philosophical arguments that aim to establish substantive philosophical theses are failures. (More on this later.) Chapters four through seven present his answers to various versions of the argument from evil. The eighth and final chapter is devoted to the "problem of divine hiddenness," which he insists is distinct from the problem of evil although it parallels that problem and receives a parallel response.
The answers to different versions of the argument from evil take the form of "defenses," stories which are such that they might be true if God exists and which, if they were true, would show that God has morally adequate reasons for permitting various sorts of evils. He first addresses the "global argument from evil," which points out that the world contains vast amounts of truly horrendous evil, and claims that this would not be the case if there were a God. Van Inwagen's answer to that is a fairly elaborate free-will defense, including a state of original righteousness in which humans enjoyed the beatific vision and also possessed preternatural powers which enabled them to protect themselves against natural evils. (There would of course be no moral evils in such a state.) The fall of the original group of humans into sin led to the loss both of the beatific vision and of the preternatural powers. Humans became subject to destruction by the random forces of nature, and also to an ever-worsening series of man-made evils in the horrific treatment of humans by other humans. God, in his love and mercy, put into operation a plan to rescue human beings from this predicament, and draw them back into the love-relationship with himself that is their only true happiness. This however requires voluntary cooperation from the human beings involved; love cannot be forced. And so,
For human beings to cooperate with God in this rescue operation, they must know that they need to be rescued. They must know what it means to be separated from him. And what it means to be separated from God is to live in a world of horrors. If God simply "canceled" all the horrors of this world by an endless series of miracles, he would thereby frustrate his own plan of reconciliation. If he did that, we should be content with our lot and should see no reason to cooperate with him (p. 88).
God does in fact prevent a great deal of the evil and suffering that would otherwise result from the rebellion against him which is the present state of the human race. But for the reasons given, he cannot prevent all of it.
Van Inwagen goes on to attend to "local" arguments from evil, arguments from particular evils that are not deflected by his response to the global argument. The first of these is an argument from horrors that lead to no greater good, or none that an omnipotent being could not have obtained without permitting the horror in question. The response is that horrors are an inevitable consequence of the separation of humans from God; by preventing all horrors God would prevent humans from becoming aware of their need to be reconciled with him. Van Inwagen contends that in general there is no minimum number of horrors that must be permitted in order to make human beings aware of the evils of their present state. (If n horrors would suffice to accomplish a certain purpose, then n - 1 horrors would accomplish the same purpose.) God cannot prevent all horrors, because that would frustrate his plan for reuniting human beings with himself. But wherever God draws the line on the number of horrors permitted, it will be an arbitrary line. In view of this, the moral requirement that God should prevent every horror that does not lead to a greater good is unsound and should be rejected.
The other local argument from evil to draw van Inwagen's attention is based on the suffering of animals. This suffering, in a great many cases, cannot be seen as the consequence of wrong-doing by human beings, and thus is untouched by the free-will defense deployed thus far. The answer to this involves several important claims: The existence of "higher-level sentient creatures" (animals that are conscious in a way comparable to the higher non-human mammals) is a great good. Any world containing such creatures either contains a great deal of animal suffering, or else is "massively irregular" due to frequent divine intervention in the ordinary course of nature. But for a world to be massively irregular is a defect at least as great as the defect of containing large amounts of animal suffering. In view of these things, God is not morally at fault for having created a world such as ours, which does indeed contain a great deal of animal suffering. Van Inwagen maintains that this "anti-irregularity defense," when conjoined with the free-will defense, constitutes "a composite defense that accounts for the sufferings of both human beings and beasts" (p. 113).
The purpose of the defenses is to show that each of the arguments from evil is a failure. But "failure" in what sense? What is it that they fail to do? For this we turn to chapter 3, "Philosophical Failure." After considering a couple of other suggestions, and rejecting them as being overly demanding, van Inwagen comes down for the view that a philosophical argument is successful if a proponent of that argument would succeed in an ideal debate. Success in such a debate is understood as the proponent's convincing an audience of "ideal agnostics" to accept the conclusion of the argument. Ideal agnostics are persons who not only do not believe either the conclusion or its denial, but beyond that are "neutral" in that they have no prior predilection for one over the other, and no view that one is more likely to be true than the other. They do, however, have a keen interest in reaching the truth about the matter under consideration, whatever that truth may be. They are of high intelligence, have unlimited time at their disposal, and are willing to persevere "as long as it takes" to reach a conclusion. The proponent of the argument has an opponent, who is as committed to the denial of the conclusion as the proponent is to the conclusion itself; both of them, like the audience, are highly intelligent, and each is well-informed about the best possible way to advocate their respective positions. Success for the proponent, and for the argument in question, is defined as persuading the members of the audience to accept the argument's conclusion. (The simplifying assumption is made that all will accept it if any do.) Success for the opponent, on the other hand, depends only on preventing this result, and getting the audience to render the "Scotch verdict" of "not proven."
Given this standard of success, van Inwagen concludes (as we've already noted) that all philosophical arguments that aim to establish substantive philosophical theses are failures. He admits, of course, that ideal debates of the sort described are difficult to find in practice. But he urges that the debates actually carried on in the community of philosophers and philosophy graduate students may be taken as a fair approximation to ideal debates, on those matters that have been extensively considered by that community. And the failure of existing philosophical arguments to produce consensus in these actual debates (van Inwagen ruefully cites his own arguments concerning free will as examples) provides strong evidence that no known argument meets the requirements for success. He considers the possibility that his criterion is too demanding, and a more liberal criterion of success should be sought. But, "Alas, there is no more liberal criterion. The criterion I have proposed is the most liberal possible criterion" (p. 160, n. 5).
The claim that no philosophical arguments are successful is quite pessimistic, and invites the question "Why then should anyone pay attention to philosophy?" Some possible answers do occur to me, but none that I think van Inwagen would find congenial. (Examples: "Because it is an amusing activity." "Because it teaches one to argue with equal plausibility on both sides of any question.") Despite his protestations, it is far from evident that his criterion should be accepted. Clearly, the ideal audience is characterized by the Enlightenment ideal of neutral, impartial reason -- but this ideal is a myth, as both postmodernists and Reformed epistemologists agree. (Van Inwagen himself states that what matters about his defense is "what genuinely neutral agnostics think of it (or what they would think of it if there were any of them)"! (p. 113)) It also is far from evident that the results of debates between actual philosophers and graduate students, none of whom conform to that Enlightenment ideal, should be taken as representative of what an ideal debate would produce. I believe, therefore, that we ought to be open to the possibility of different standards of philosophical success than the one van Inwagen has suggested, but that topic cannot be pursued further in this review.
Van Inwagen does not, of course, simply infer the failure of arguments from evil from his general claim that all philosophical arguments are failures. His defenses are intended precisely to show that the various arguments from evil fail. But what exactly is a defense? To begin with, a defense is not a theodicy, which attempts to "state the real truth of the matter … about why a just God allows evil" (p. 6). A defense, in contrast, is a story that might be true if God exists. But the "might" here does not indicate mere logical possibility, as it does in Plantinga's free will defense against the logical problem of evil. Rather the "might" represents epistemic possibility: a defense is a story that may be true "for all anyone knows." It is like a story presented by a defense attorney in court, intended to account for the evidence in a way that is consistent with the innocence of the accused, and thus create "reasonable doubt" in the minds of the jurors. Such a defense must not contravene known facts, nor should it be so incredible that the possibility of its truth can reasonably be disregarded entirely. But a defense need not be true to be successful, nor does it need to be plausible, nor need it be believed true either by its proponent or by the audience. It is perfectly acceptable to have a number of defenses with respect to a particular kind or instance of evil that contradict each other; evidently they cannot all be true, but each of them may be true for all anyone knows, so each contributes to the result that the corresponding argument from evil is unsuccessful.
I think it is likely that van Inwagen's various defenses satisfy the criteria he has stated for a defense, and will serve the purpose of showing that the arguments from evil he considers are failures, in his sense of "failure." To be sure, some people might like to have more than this by way of an answer to the problem of evil. Perhaps they would like to have a theodicy, a true account of why God permits evils to exist. Van Inwagen, however, is not required to satisfy these demands; if necessary, he can refer such persons to the appropriate theological authorities for further help with their quest. But there is reason to think that even considered on its own terms, his project accomplishes less than is needed. It seems entirely possible that an argument from evil, in contest with one of his defenses, might persuade the agnostics in question, who initially regarded theism and atheism as equally probable, to view atheism as considerably more probable, more likely to be true, than theism -- and this while they still remain agnostics, not actually believing either that theism is true or that it is false. Given this outcome, van Inwagen would presumably claim that the argument from evil has been a failure, and that his defense was a success, because it prevented the proponent of the argument from making atheists out of the agnostic audience. It is doubtful, however, whether many others will share van Inwagen's estimate of this outcome. Could van Inwagen modify his criterion to say that an argument is successful if it leads the agnostic audience to raise by a significant degree their estimate of the likelihood that the conclusion is true? He could indeed do this -- but then it might be harder to maintain that no existing arguments are successful, and plausibility would become more important than he seems willing to allow. The courtroom analogy may be misleading here: In a criminal trial, any result short of "guilty beyond reasonable doubt" counts as a victory for the defense. Not so, however, in philosophy.
In view of this, it seems reasonable to suggest that van Inwagen might consider raising his sights a bit, and attempting to provide more than a "defense" as he has defined the term. It is even possible that he could do this without greatly modifying the actual stories that constitute his defenses. In spite of his official position that plausibility is not required, he does evince at times a concern for the plausibility of his stories. Nor is the truth of what he is proposing a matter of complete indifference to him. (Here there is a distinction he does not make, but that I think is important: A story may be true in what it says, and may show that God is justified in permitting certain evils, and yet it may not give God's actual reason for permitting the evils in question. We might term this a "modest theodicy," in contrast with "immodest theodicies" that do claim to know God's reasons. A theodicist, I suggest, should always leave open the possibility that God has reasons for what he does that are other and better than any that have occurred to us.) In a slightly earlier essay, van Inwagen presents his free-will defense and then asks, "Do I believe it? Well, I believe parts of it and I don't disbelieve any of it… . I am not at all sure about 'preternatural powers,' for example, or about the proposition that God shields us from much evil and that the world would be far worse if he did not" ("The Argument from Evil," in Peter van Inwagen, ed., Christian Faith and the Problem of Evil (Grand Rapids, Mich.: William B. Eerdmans, 2004), p.72). According to this, he does regard his free-will defense, in its main outlines, as being true -- so it may after all constitute at least the core of a modest theodicy.