I will begin by saying that I found this book quite literally hard to read. The book is printed with the sort of small font and close typesetting usually reserved for encyclopedias. No doubt this unfortunate typesetting was necessitated by the extremely wide coverage of the book. The Routledge Companion to Ancient Philosophy (RCAP) aims to cover the philosophy of the ancient Greek and Roman world from the end of the sixth century BC to the sixth century AD; to my knowledge, it is the most comprehensive overview of Greek and Roman philosophy to date. Given its ambitious aim of covering philosophical developments spanning more than 1200 years, a more humane typesetting choice would have pushed the RCAP beyond its already long length of 700 pages. It is unfortunate that eyestrain discourages long sittings with the book, as the RCAP is precisely the sort of book that should be a pleasure to work through leisurely. For the most part its articles are not highly specialized but rather broad-brush stroke summaries. Even those of us who work in ancient philosophy will find the volume helpful for consulting its big picture treatments of those areas of ancient philosophy with which we are less familiar. In this respect, the RCAP has offerings not only for the newcomer to ancient philosophy but for established scholars as well. If you grab your magnifying glass, you will reap rewards.
The volume is divided into 5 parts: (1) Before Plato, (2) Plato, (3) Aristotle, (4) Hellenistic Philosophy, and (5) Philosophy in the Empire and Beyond. Making up these five parts are 47 articles from a diverse group of classicists and ancient philosophers, including a good number from outside North America and the United Kingdom. By bringing together such a diverse group, the RCAP showcases a variety of styles and emphases that one does not always find in ancient philosophy anthologies. (One complaint regarding contributors: only 7/47 of the contributors are women -- a rate of around 15%. Given that ancient philosophy is one of the few areas of philosophy with a good number of female practitioners, 15% is too low.)
In his introduction, co-editor James Warren does not attempt the impossible task of offering a chapter-by-chapter summary of the 47 articles. Instead he helpfully but briefly sets out general interpretive problems that arise from translation and transmission complications and from the distinctive forms of writing that we find in certain ancient philosophical texts -- Plato's dialogue form and Aristotle's dialectical form, for example. Warren's summary of these challenges is especially useful for the ancient philosophy newcomer who is unaware of the significant philological, archeological, and philosophical work that goes into standard student translations of ancient philosophy texts. In addition to his brief introduction, he and co-editor Frisbee Sheffield provide cross-references and secondary literature recommendations at the end of each chapter.
Because the book is immense both in length and topical range, it is impossible for this review to address each article. Moreover, as I mentioned above, many of the articles are rather broad-brush stroke and even book reportish in nature, making them inappropriate objects for focused discussion. Thus, my review will aim to give a general overview of each of the five sections, focusing along the way on some of the articles that argue for more controversial theses.
Opening the section is John Palmer's overview of the pre-Socratics in which he argues that what was distinctive of the Pre-Socratics was their commitment to (i) the world's intelligibility and (ii) naturalized rather than theocentric accounts of natural phenomena. Subsequent chapters focus on specific Pre-Socratic thinkers, Socrates, and Socrates' contemporaries.
A nice article in this section is Noburu Notomi's piece on the Sophists. Notomi helpfully examines whether the Sophists were a unified group, and if so, what we should identify as their defining feature. He argues that what ultimately defined them was their professionalization of philosophy -- they charged money for their teaching -- and thus differed from other Greek intellectuals like Thales, Solon, Anaxagoras, Empedocles and Socrates. Notomi emphasizes that it was Plato who insisted on characterizing Sophists as bogus philosophers who possessed merely apparent, not real, wisdom, and Notomi argues that Plato's characterization is not obviously fair, since whether one thinks the Sophists were real philosophers depends in part on one's own individual approach to philosophy. Someone who is sympathetic with Nietzsche's philosophy, for example, may quite reasonably regard Sophists like Thrasymachus and Callicles as philosophers on a par with Socrates.
Jenny Bryan's piece on Socrates nicely complements Notomi's discussion. Bryan's article focuses on the so-called "Socratic Problem," the problem of identifying the real, historical Socrates amidst the conflicting second-hand accounts of him. (As far as we know, Socrates himself never wrote anything.) Bryan's essay examines the contrasting accounts of Socrates offered by Aristophanes, Plato, Xenophon, and Aristotle, identifying along the way the significance of those accounts' similarities and differences. Among her interesting claims is that, to the layman, Socrates and the Sophists were hard to distinguish. In support of this claim, she points out that in Plato's Apology, Socrates attributes his poor reputation to Aristophanes' depiction of him in the Clouds. According to the Clouds, Socrates is a hodge-podge thinker who promulgates wild and potentially dangerous theories on topics ranging from religion to natural philosophy. Bryan points out that Socrates' explanation for his poor reputation can be correct only if the Clouds' portrait of Socrates had become somewhat widely held. Bryan then points out that the Clouds' representation of Socrates could have become widely held only if Socrates' activities were easily misconstrued as relevantly similar to the Sophists' activities. Such misconstrual is understandable, if we assume that Socrates and the Sophists ran in similar intellectual circles and publically expressed interests in virtue and its teachability. So Bryan, like Notomi, suggests that the stark opposition Plato draws between Socrates and the Sophists has the potential to obscure their similarities, both the real similarities and the merely apparent similarities.
The Plato section is remarkably wide-ranging, covering topics including (but not limited to) Platonic metaphysics (Allan Silverman), epistemology (David Wolfsdorf), moral psychology (James Doyle), poetics (Gabriel Richardson Lear) and cosmology (Andrew Mason). Alex Long's opening article, "Reading Plato," provides a nice discussion of Socratic irony and summarizes some of the approaches one might take when confronted with the contrasting portraits of Socrates across the Platonic dialogues. Here's one such contrast: the Socrates of the Apology and the Euthyphro insists that he has no philosophical interests outside of moral philosophy, but the Socrates of the Phaedo and the Republic theorizes about metaphysics and epistemology. Developmentalists explain these contrasting treatments by stipulating that Plato's interest in Socrates changes over the course of his dialogues; Plato's early dialogues were devoted to exploring the historical Socrates, but in the later dialogues Plato's purpose changes, and he starts using Socrates as a mouthpiece for his (Plato's) own ideas, many of which are metaphysical and epistemological in nature. Unitarians, by contrast, stipulate that Plato's dialogues were never intended to showcase the historical Socrates' views or interests but were always Plato's vehicles for presenting and exploring Plato's own views. Long proposes a possible "middle position" according to which Plato's dialogues are always exploring Socrates' philosophy, but in some (e.g., Phaedo and Republic) Plato presents what he thinks Socrates would have thought about a particular metaphysical or epistemological issue had Socrates devoted time to thinking about it. Whether one accepts this "middle position," Long's proposal helpfully gestures at the wide range of interpretive possibilities that one might take when confronting the seemingly different portraits of Socrates that we find in Plato's dialogues.
In an essay on Plato's method, Raphael Woolf argues that Socrates' typical elenchus is concerned solely with exposing his interlocutors' ignorance by getting them to assent to inconsistent propositions; Socrates has no interest in using the elenchus to support his own favored doctrines. What does Woolf mean by his claim that Socrates has no interest in using the elenchus to support Socratic doctrines? Sometimes Woolf seems to mean that Socrates does not take the elenchus to offer incontrovertible proof for any particular proposition that Socrates favors. That seems right, as Socrates regularly suggests that he is prepared to hear arguments that will show his view to be false. However, this kind of provisional attitude is not enough to entail that Socrates uses the elenchus only to expose inconsistencies in his interlocutors' belief systems. After all, it's possible that Socrates thinks that the elenchus can lend some justificatory support to particular propositions he favors, albeit defeasible justification that falls short of the justification required for proof or knowledge. Thus, Socrates' own beliefs are provisional in the sense that he denies that they can be defended by an ironclad proof. But this is compatible with Socrates thinking that the elenchus can help us identify beliefs that are likely to be true. Attributing such a positive role to the elenchus has the benefit of explaining why Socrates in the Crito uses the elenchus to arrive at the practical judgment that he should remain in prison. It also explains why, when Socrates and his interlocutors discover an inconsistency in his interlocutors' belief set, they single out a particular belief for rejection. Inconsistency among propositions shows that at least one of the propositions must be wrong, but it doesn't by itself indicate which proposition is wrong. Thus, were Woolf's thesis right, we should expect Socrates and his interlocutors to suspend judgment on which proposition(s) of the inconsistent belief set should be retained and which should be rejected. But we do not seem to find such radical suspension of judgment. (See, e.g., the Laches elenchus, where Socrates and his interlocutors resolve an inconsistent belief set by rejecting the proposition that lions are courageous. In the elenchus of the Euthyphro, Socrates and his interlocutors resolve the inconsistency by rejecting the proposed definition of piety.) These cases suggest that Socrates regards the elenchus as having the power to provide (at least in certain cases) some justification for certain Socratic beliefs.
James Doyle's essay on Platonic moral psychology discusses the motivation for Socratic intellectualism (Socrates' view that all desire rests on a person's all-things-considered judgment about what is best) and the considerations that made Plato ultimately reject intellectualism in favor of a view that posits three distinct motivational sources: reason, spirit, and appetite. Plato sometimes speaks of these three sources as "parts" of the soul, and Doyle discusses two ways of understanding this "part talk" and in particular two ways of understanding the relation of soul parts to the soul considered as a whole. According to the first interpretation, each of the parts is a distinct center of agency, making the soul as a whole analogous to a set of Siamese triplets (albeit triplets with mutual mind-reading abilities). Call this the "Siamese Triplets View." On the Siamese Triplets view, psychological predications are strictly speaking predications of individual soul-parts; what desires food is not me (considered as a whole person or soul) but rather my appetitive soul part. On the second view -- the "Capacities View" -- reason, spirit, and appetite are simply different psychological capacities (not distinct parts or agents) that characterize a single soul. On the Capacities View, psychological predications are strictly speaking predications of that single soul, not predications of individual soul parts. To my mind, Doyle's discussion doesn't make totally clear what is philosophically at stake in deciding between these two views, but in any case he ends up rejecting both pictures, arguing that Plato deliberately left indeterminate what serves as subject psychological predications. In support of this indeterminacy thesis, Doyle cites the Republic's claim that in cities that have conflicting parts or classes, there "is not a city, but very many cities" (Republic 422d). On the basis of this passage Doyle concludes that in conflicted souls (souls where reason, spirit, and appetite have conflicting aims), there is no single soul to serve as the subject of the various psychological states; to use Doyle's examples, a conflicted soul is like a forged banknote or fake diamond, cases where the adjective implies that the noun doesn't really apply. In line with this idea, Doyle argues that in cases where a person has conflicting (say) appetitive and rational desires, there is no single soul to serve as psychological subject; in these cases, the appropriate model is the Siamese Triplets picture. However, in agents who experience no psychic conflict among desires (the case of virtuous agents, for example), there is a single soul, and so the Capacities View is the appropriate model. As should be clear, Doyle's argument relies on a very literal reading of the Republic passage, and I imagine that one could easily block Doyle's indeterminacy thesis by proposing a plausible non-literal interpretation of the passage. But again, it not crystal clear to me just how much is philosophically at stake in choosing between the various models (especially when one considers that on the Siamese Triplets picture, the parts are not totally walled off from each other but on the contrary have some access to the activities and functionings of the other parts.)
Rachana Kamtekar's "Philosopher Rulers" argues that Plato turns to philosophers' rule in response to his theorizing about what she calls the "content problem" of political expertise. What is the content problem? Every expertise has (i) a distinctive subject matter and (ii) a distinctive good that the expertise produces. The content problem is the problem of identifying (i) and (ii) for political expertise. Plato ends up identifying the Form of the Good as political expertise's subject matter and political virtue (virtue of citizens) as its distinctive product, and (according to Kamtekar) this resolution of the content problem is what requires Plato to adopt philosophers' rule. Philosophers by definition are those who know the Form of the Good, making them experts in political matters. Since it is the expert who should practice the expertise in question, philosophers are the ones who should direct political matters. Kamtekar thus rejects the view, held by some scholars, that Plato advocates philosophers' rule simply because he thinks that philosophers aren't the sort to desire power and so won't abuse it. Kamtekar rejects this proposal on the grounds that harmlessness is not enough to justify philosophers' rule if philosophers are incompetent. In response to the objection that non-philosophers can make correct judgments about the good and that such judgments should qualify them to rule, Kamtekar grants that non-philosophers (those without philosophical knowledge of the Good) can make some correct judgments about the good (indeed, the condition of political virtue just is the condition whereby citizens have correct beliefs about what is to be feared, etc.), but she insists that knowledge of the Form of the Good is necessary to guarantee the accuracy of these judgments. Her idea is that without knowing the Form of the Good, one will occasionally go wrong in particular cases, and thus Plato has good reason to restrict rule to philosophers. In the introductory paragraph Kamtekar says that she hopes that her argument about Plato's rationale for introducing philosophers' rule "will improve our ability to evaluate the idea and to hold on to what is of enduring value in it" (199). So what is of enduring value in the idea of philosophers' rule? If there is anything, it seems to be the idea that expertise matters when it comes to determining who should rule (though few sane people would think that it is all that matters.)
Aristotle's philosophical work is so massive both in its topical range and sheer volume that a truly comprehensive overview of his thought is impossible, even for an anthology as large as the RCAP. Inevitably, then, there are some significant lacunae in the Aristotle section; you will not find chapters on Aristotle's biology, nor his moral psychology, for example. Still, the Aristotle section covers a lot of ground, with discussions on topics including (but not restricted to) Aristotelian logic (Ermelinda Di Lascio), knowledge and inquiry (Hendrik Lorenz), philosophy of nature (Andrea Falcon), ethics (Dominic Scott), and metaphysics (Christopher Shields).
Antony Hatzistavrou's "Aristotle on the Political Life" contends that there is a tension between Aristotle's (i) commitment to political justice and (ii) commitment to the idea that happiness requires political participation. The political justice commitment dictates that political power should be distributed according to merit, and thus requires the less virtuous to give up political power to the more virtuous. But Aristotle also thinks that happiness requires political participation, and thus he must think that those who give up political power sacrifice their happiness. I wonder if Aristotle might resolve this tension by recommending a setup like the following. In accordance with political justice, the most virtuous person must have sovereign power. However, in accordance with his idea that happiness requires political participation, everyone must have some political duties, including perhaps legislative duties. Giving such political duties to the less virtuous does not compromise the virtuous person's sovereignty, provided that the virtuous person retains the right to veto any verdicts with which she disagrees.
In his entry on Aristotle's aesthetics, David O'Connor argues against a popular interpretation of Aristotle's definition of tragedy. Aristotle first defines tragedy as "an imitation of a significant, complete action . . . that through pity and fear effects the catharsis of these sorts of sufferings" (Poetics 6 1449b24-8). Most commentators take "sufferings" and "pity and fear" in the definition to refer to the audience's emotions, and in turn interpret "catharsis" to mean some kind of refinement of the audience's emotional disposition. One disadvantage of this "audience-centered" reading is that Aristotle nowhere else says anything about this refinement of the audience's pity and fear. Such silence is surprising, if this refinement in the audience is a defining feature of tragedy. In response to this worry, O'Connor proposes that we adopt instead a "story-centered" reading of Aristotle's definition of tragedy, according to which "sufferings" in the definition refers not to the audience's emotions but rather to the sufferings of the protagonist in the story -- sufferings like death, torture, and wounding. "Catharsis" on this reading will then refer to the resolution of the story's tension, where such tension is the result of the reversals of fortune that, according to Aristotle, are necessary parts of tragedy. So O'Connor rejects the idea that a defining feature of tragedy is a cathartic refinement of the audience's feelings of pity and fear. That said, he does recognize that tragedies have a profound psychological effect on the audience -- they provoke "wonder" and "elevate" the audience -- and this fact naturally gives rise to the following issue: What is it about tragedy that makes it capable of elevating and provoking wonder in the audience? O'Connor suggests that Aristotle's treatment of the mega-virtues (megaloprepeia -- the virtue pertaining to large public benefaction, often translated as "magnificence," and megalopsychia -- the virtue pertaining to having the right attitudes towards large honors, often translated as "magnanimity") offer clues to tragedy's abilities to enchant the audience, as these mega- virtues, too, tend to provoke wonder in those who behold them. Ultimately, O'Connor's proposal is that both the mega-virtues and tragedy "elevate" and "produce wonder" in their beholders because both display a special kind of magnitude. Magnitude, thus, is a crucial concept for O'Connor's argument; the hard part is figuring out what exactly magnitude is.
With regard to the magnitude of the mega-virtues, O'Connor immediately rejects a quantitative notion according to which the magnitude of a magnificent action lies in the fact that the action involves spending large sums of money. The problem with this quantitative notion of megaloprepeia's magnitude is that Aristotle sees that two people can make an equal expenditure on the same public good and yet only one produce a magnificent result. O'Connor thus proposes that the magnitude of magnificence is non-quantitative and has something to do with the "freedom and power" that magnificent actions display: the magnificent person acts freely, without impediments. O'Connor connects this freedom with the magnificent person's ability to make her expenditure an active accomplishment (ergon) as opposed to the mere obtainment of a possession, a contrast Aristotle himself uses to describe the magnificent person (1122b14-18). O'Connor gives the following illustration: "To pay for a good party, elegant and tasteful, is the part of an ordinary man; to put on a party that costs no more, but that is an event, not just a good time, is the part of the mega-man" (381). I confess that, even with this gloss, I found it difficult to pinpoint the nature of the magnitude that explains what it is that the magnificent person has but the merely rich and beneficent person lacks. The unclarity is not entirely O'Connor's fault, as Aristotle himself is very quick and mysterious about what the 'mega' is in megaloprepeia that makes magnificent actions so wonderful to contemplate. In any case O'Connor then turns to magnitude in the case of tragedy, aiming to show how the magnitude that explains the wonderous effect of the mega-virtues also explains the wonderous effect of tragedy. One worry I have about O'Connor's attempt to draw this parallel is that when Aristotle talks about magnitude in the tragedy case, he seems to have something rather quantitative in mind: tragedy requires a certain length (Poetics 1450b34-1451a11, 1459b17-20). If, as O'Connor insists, the magnitude that makes the mega-virtues wonderous is a non-quantitative kind of magnitude, then it's unclear whether the magnitude of the mega-virtues can help illuminate the power of tragedy. As interesting as O'Connor's proposal is, more clarification and interpretive work needs to be done on the concept of magnitude to make his case.
In the "Aristotle: Psychology" chapter, Giles Pearson offers a helpful overview of the major interpretive disputes pertaining to Aristotle's account of perception. While Pearson does not argue for any especially controversial claim, I mention his paper because it is a model in my view of what is useful about so many of the articles in the RCAP -- viz., they summarize the major interpretive disputes of a particular area of ancient philosophy and thus give the reader a sense of the interpretive terrain. In his entry Pearson skillfully summarizes some of the most important debates in interpretation of Aristotelian philosophy of mind, including the so- called "Ackrill problem" and the Myles Burnyeat and Richard Sorabji debate about whether Aristotelian perception is literalist or spiritualist. After offering brief overviews of perception, phantasia, and thought, Pearson concludes by offering some final brief comments about whether Aristotle's psychology has any application to contemporary debate about mind-body issues.
Warren begins the Hellenistic section with a short but helpful overview of the places and institutions that shaped the Hellenistic period. Subsequent articles are focused discussions of particular Hellenistic schools: the Cynics (Eric Brown), Cyrenaics (Warren), Stoics (Thomas Bénatouïl), Epicureans (Tim O'Keefe and Pierre-Marie Morel), Academic Skeptics (Katja Vogt), Early Pyrrhonists (Luca Castagnoli), and Peripatetics (Han Baltussen). Eric Brown's paper on the Cynics includes an entertaining selection of anecdotes and smart discussions about whether Cynicism is a way of life only, how similar cynicism is to Stoicism, and the role of friendship in Cynicism.
Tim O'Keefe's paper on Epicurean physics and epistemology is also lively. After giving an overview of Epicurean atomism, cosmology, biology, psychology, and epistemology, he ends with a more detailed discussion of the Epicurean gods. The fact that the Epicureans posit gods at all is a bit surprising, since gods play no explanatory role in the Epicurean naturalist system (which consists of purposeless interactions of atoms in the void). Yet Epicurus says that it is obvious (enargês) that the gods exist. How should we understand these gods? On one interpretation, the "realist" interpretation, the Epicurean gods are mind-independent biological beings. They are also eternal -- a puzzling feature given that Epicurus seems to think that all biological organisms eventually disintegrate from the impact of the universe's blows. In response to this puzzle, advocates of the realist interpretation suggest that gods evade death because, unlike other biological organisms, they inhabit a tranquil realm free from the blows that cause the disintegration of biological beings and compound objects in general. On the alternative "idealization view" of the gods -- the view that O'Keefe favors -- the gods are not mind-independent biological entities at all but rather ideas in our minds; in particular, the gods are mind-dependent idealizations of blessed human beings. Against the realist view, O'Keefe cites passages (Lucretius, 1.526-39 and 3.806-18) that say that the only eternal things are individual atoms, the void, and that which lacks nearby empty space into which to disperse (that is, the boundaries of the universe). O'Keefe takes these passages to be enough to rule out the realist interpretation, but this dismissal seems a bit quick to me. It seems open to the realist to argue that the passages O'Keefe cites are describing only the parts of the universe that are subject to blows. In particular, the passages are not offered as universal statements that apply even to the tranquil realm of the gods, the realm that is free from blows. Such a move is not obviously ad hoc; after all, according to Epicurus, the gods play no role in the world that we experience, and this arguably gives the gods a peripheral status that makes it reasonable for Lucretius to occasionally bracket them and their idiosyncratic realm from his accounts.
Katja Maria Vogt's "The Hellenistic Academy" discusses the skeptical turn of Plato's Academy after the classical period. She calls this skeptical turn "Socratic," since she takes Socrates himself to be a kind of skeptic. More specifically, Vogt argues that both the Academic skeptics and Socrates think that "in pursuing knowledge, one aims to get rid of belief (doxa)" (485), since beliefs (on this view) are not value-neutral but rather "deficient judgments and cases of ignorance" (485). I was surprised by this claim about Socrates' attitudes towards beliefs (doxai). This may be true of the Skeptics, but why think this is true of Socrates? She gives several arguments to support this characterization of Socrates; here, I'll focus on just one of her arguments, which draws on the Apology. In the Apology, the Delphic oracle claims that no one is wiser than Socrates, and this perplexes Socrates, who at the time takes himself to be "aware (sunoida) of being wise (sophos) in nothing" (21b4-5). To decipher the oracle's meaning he cross-examines those who take themselves to have knowledge, a group that includes politicians, poets, and craftsmen. At one point after one of these cross-examinations, Socrates concludes the following:
It is likely that neither of us knows anything fine and good. But he thinks that he knows something he does not know, whereas I, just as I do not know, neither do I think I know. Indeed, it seems that I am wiser than he to this small extent, that what I do not know, neither do I think I know" (21d3-7).
Vogt interprets these events as follows:
Socrates is better off than these other people because, though he, too, does not know about important matters, he at least knows that he does not have this knowledge. The ignorance of his interlocutors is presented as presumed knowledge. . . . ignorance is not understood as the absence of an attitude toward a certain content. Rather, ignorance is a state of holding to be true. In endorsing something, one commits oneself as if one had knowledge. Accordingly, ignorance is a truth claim that misunderstands itself as a piece of knowledge. Plato does not discuss beliefs in the Apology, but it seems safe to say that Socrates' interlocutors have mere beliefs, and that these beliefs are cases of ignorance. (485)
The Apology episode that Vogt cites is not good evidence for Vogt's thesis that Socrates wishes to rid himself of belief. Socrates' point about his wisdom and his interlocutor's ignorance does indeed show that taking yourself to know something when you do not know is a case of ignorance. But nothing about this commitment entails that there's something essentially bad (and so to be avoided) about all beliefs. I can believe p (and even believe that I have some justification for p) without purporting to know p (perhaps I take my justification for p to fall short of what would be required for knowing p). The case I just described is not a case of presumed knowledge. So while Socrates surely thinks that presumed knowledge is a kind of ignorance, we can have beliefs without presuming those beliefs to be knowledge. And so nothing about the Apology episode that Vogt cites suggests that Socrates regards belief as in itself bad. What he does take to be bad (and constitute ignorance) are unjustified, false beliefs that one takes oneself to know; this leaves it open whether beliefs in general are bad and to be avoided. And in fact there is good reason to think that Socrates does not try to avoid beliefs, but on the contrary holds beliefs and believes that his beliefs are justified. Attributing such beliefs to Socrates helps us reconcile why Socrates constantly disavows knowledge (Apology 21b-d), and yet consistently gives moral advice and makes moral claims (Apology 29b, 30b). If Socrates takes himself to have beliefs that are justified (though not so justified so as to qualify as knowledge), he has reason to give advice to those whom he thinks have false beliefs.
Philosophy in the Empire and Beyond
Ricardo Salles begins the section with an overview of Roman Stoicism during the 1st and 2nd centuries AD, and Peter Adamson closes the section with a discussion of the Arabic reception of ancient philosophy in the 11th and 12th centuries. In between we get discussions of major thinkers like Sextus and Plotinus, but also discussions of lesser-known figures like the Middle Platonists, Galen, Porphyry, Iamblichus, Syrianus, Proclus, and Damascius. This section covers material with which I am quite unfamiliar, so I will restrict myself to making some brief remarks about two essays I especially enjoyed.
In "Ancient Philosophy in Christian Sources," Mark Edwards discusses early Christian authors' treatments of the Greek philosophers, focusing on the questions of how much these Christian authors knew about Greek philosophy and how the concern to dismiss heretical views may have biased their readings of the Greeks. His discussion covers Clement of Alexandria, Hippolytus of Rome, Tertullian of Carthage, Origen of Alexandria, and Eusebius of Caesarea. According to Edwards, many of these Christian thinkers attempted to trace heretical teachings to errors of the Greeks (Empedocles, for example, is accused of being the precursor to Marcion's heretical claim that the Creator is evil). Moreover, even when Christian theology and Greek philosophy displayed some commonalities or areas of overlap, there was a tendency of Christian thinkers to show that the Christian ideas were better and/or more original. Throughout the piece, Edwards gives memorable examples. Here's just one: Origen argues that Lot's sexual intercourse with his daughters was less obscene than Love's conception in the Symposium. Origen has his work cut out for him, as Lot's episode is very disturbing.
Adamson's "The Arabic Reception of Greek Philosophy" presents various distortions (arising from translation and transmission problems) that characterize some Arabic accounts of Greek philosophy. He covers Arabic accounts of Socrates, Plato, Galen, Aristotle, and Hellenistic philosophy, arguing that in many places the Neoplatonists excessively influenced how the Arab world received Greek philosophy. The essay provides a nice overview for anyone (like myself) who is largely ignorant of the dynamics that influenced Arabic interpretations of Greek philosophy.
As I hope will be clear from this very brief overview, the RCAP has a lot to offer. There is a chapter in here for even most seasoned ancient scholar. That said, I will end by noting a few areas where the volume could be improved. First, the volume would be more effective if it contained brief scene-setting introductions for each of the five sections. While some sections begin with articles that contain general biographical and context-setting information, some do not. While space was no doubt an issue, it would have been worth including a single page at the start of each section to provide timelines and other scene-setting information. The lack of such situating tools is especially problematic in the last section ("Philosophy in the Empire and Beyond"), since the articles in that section discusses philosophical developments that span over 700 years. Without the help of a timeline, the only way for the reader to situate the various philosophers is by compiling the many dates scattered across articles. Secondly, the volume could have benefitted from a bit more editorial effort devoted to ensuring uniformity of style across articles. For the most part, the articles are rather broad-brush stroke summaries of a particular topic. However, as should be clear from this review, other articles have a different approach, starting with a relatively specific interpretive question and proceeding to argue for a substantial position on the issue. This gives the book a slightly schizophrenic feel that some readers may find disorienting. These two small shortcomings aside, the RCAP is a welcome addition to the field of ancient philosophy. I learned much from my first sitting with the book, and I am sure that I will have reason to turn to it in the future (although next time I'll come armed with a magnifying glass).