For most of us, watching a masterful artist at work is always delightful and humbling. This is the sort of conclusion I think many people will form after they put down Ralph M. McInerny’s delightful monograph The Very Rich Hours of Jacques Maritain. Coming to contact with a great intellect, even at a far distance, is a joy. Being introduced to a great intellect by a masterful author, a great mind, in a personal way, is doubly enriching. In every way, this is a beautiful book. In parts, it is also controversial.
By any sober and serious scholar’s estimate, Jacques Maritain was a great intellect and an extraordinary human being, an enigma of sorts, much like Socrates of Athens. A man born of a feminist and domineering mother, “one of France’s first divorcées” (p. 208) herself born of adulterous relationship by his grandfather. The son of a no-account father, whose life ended in suicide, and grandson of one of the country’s leading freethinkers and politicians, Jules Favre, Maritain, who would later pride himself as a “revolutionary” and friend of Saul Alinsky, received his first Christian instruction from a Protestant tutor, and was radicalized in his youth by the socialist husband of the family’s cook, François Baton. Early in his life, McInerny tells us, Jacques developed a distaste for “the dreaded bourgeoise” (p. 9). In his youth, while he attended the Lycée Henri IV and studied rhetoric, he dedicated himself to socialism; and already by this time he had developed his “romantic desire to be ’with the people’“, a detestation of people “on the right” that would viscerally remain with him much of his life, and, what McInerny fittingly labels, a “romantic radicalism” without which we cannot understand many of his later political alliances and thought. At this time, he formed his famous friendship with Ernest Psichari, grandson of the rationalistic apostate Ernest Renan (pp. 8–10).
Maritain eventually wound up in his college years at the Sorbonne, marrying the emigrant Russian Jewess, Raïssa Oumansov. In the Jardin des Plantes they resolved to commit suicide because they lived in an intellectual atmosphere smothered by freethinking positivism, where they could find no metaphysical fresh air to breathe, only to be saved by Henri Bergson. The two would eventually marry, mainly as a result of Raïssa’s decision would live together in a celibate, mystical, relationship that would include the wife’s sister, Vera, thereby forming what they called a “little flock” (pp. 10–46).
No need to go very far into this text to see the intellectual thread that McInerny uses to weave this biographical tale: “The life of Jacques Maritain can only be understood as the pursuit of sanctity through the life of study of philosophy, and, in the end, theology” (p. 207). No better way, then, to divide the text than to model and order its main parts after the medieval canonical book of hours: Matins and Lauds, followed by Prime, Tierce, Sext, Nones, Vespers, and Compline.
According to McInerny, “Maritain was a philosopher who metamorphosed into a theologian in his last years” (p. 3). His spiritual quest, and Raïssa’s, had begun years before, as far back as Bergson’s lectures that they had attended with Charles Péguy. After their marriage in 1904, which McInerny says Jacques’s mother Geneviève Favre could scarcely have regarded as fitting, the young couple started to read, and met their unlikely spiritual godfather, Leon Bloy.
So started the tale of the Maritains’ conversion. By 1905, under Bloy’s influence, their over-riding life’s purpose was “to become holy even as their heavenly father was holy, to become saints.” With Raïssa taking the lead, they started to divide their days up around spiritual exercises. Under Bloy’s influence, they became especially attached to Our Lady of LaSalette, especially the apparitions and Secret (pp. 32–40). By 1918, after “the Holy office issued a decree forbidding any sort of treatment or discussion of the Secret of LaSalette under any treatment or in any form, they traveled to Rome where Jacques consulted with his mentor and friend, Father Reginald Garrigou-Lagrange, and confronted Pope Benedict XV about the matter (p. 41).
This confrontation, in which Maritain as a young convert had displayed no hesitation expressing his disagreement with the Pope on a spiritual matter, gives McInerny ammunition to support his claim that we cannot reasonably explain Maritain’s later flirtation with Action Française, and the extreme political Right, as a lapse in judgment caused by his “susceptibility to the advice of his spiritual advisors” (p. 42). McInerny sees Raïssa as the main source of such a revisionistic historical interpretation of Jacques’ infamous political turn. The common interpretation that Maritain scholars give to his association with Action Française is to blame this on Jacques’s alleged susceptibility to his spiritual directors, especially to Father Humbert Clérissac, into whose nefarious clutches the Maritains supposedly fell after Benedictine abbot Dom Delatte had recommended Clerissac to them as a spiritual director (p. 48). McInerny soberly reminds us that Maritain was putty in the hands of no one. A better explanation is Maritain’s lifelong “romantic radicalism,” a political naïveté from which, as McInerny recognizes, Jacques was never able completely to liberate himself. He was never at home in the practical world. Instead, “his excursions into the practical” resemble “Plato’s philosopher being dragged against his bent into the political realm” (p. 64).
The Maritains continued their spiritual quest as oblates of St. Benedict. The year was now 1913. Jacques published his first book, La philosophie bergsonienne, in which, among other things, he excessively, in my opinion shamefully, attacked the man who helped save him from suicide. In the same year, he moved from teaching at the Collège Stanislas to become an adjunct professor at the Institut Catholique.
The next year was tragic for the young couple. Psichari and Charles Péguy died in battle during the first year of World War I. Fr. Clérissac also died. The Maritains’ sadness was offset by their introduction to Father Dehau, the future Cardinal Charles Journet, who replaced Fr. Clérissac as their spiritual advisor and life-long friend.
Within a few years, their fortunes dramatically changed, extensively as the result of a bequest from a bourgeoise. Pierre Villard had taken a course on German philosophy from Jacques at the Institut Catholique, and had emptied his soul to the philosopher. Villard died in battle during the War, and left his estate to Maritain and Charles Maurras, the leader of Action Française.
This newly found wealth enabled Jacques, Raïssa, and Vera to move to Meudon in 1924, where Jacques started his famous Thomistic Study Circles. Their fifteen years there were tumultuous. Maritain attempted to rival the negative literary influence of André Gide in French culture and came into public conflict with Jean Cocteau. Among the things that McInerny tells us caused conflict among Gide, Cocteau, and Maritain was Gide’s celebration of homosexuality in the book Corydon, and Cocteau’s flamboyant lifestyle as a homosexual drug addict and his overall character as “an enfant terrible of artistic innovation” (p. 100).
By the mid-1920s and 1930s, Maritain had started to immerse himself in the study of St. Thomas Aquinas. This philosophical and theological immersion would cause his intellectual life to enter its golden age. During this time, McInerny tells us, Maritain took “an axe to the roots of modern culture” in his book Three Reformers”(p. 141). He published major works on Christian philosophy, art and scholasticism, René Descartes, epistemology, poetry, Christian humanism, and Judaism. In 1939, he published The Twilight of Civilization in which he attacked the new paganism that generated the sort of political thought expressed by Carl Schmitt. The 1930s would also see him come into conflict with old friends like Paul Claudel over Maritain’s political position on the Spanish Civil War. And he would make friends with Étienne Gilson.
The wider conflict of World War II would cause him to leave France in 1940 and start his love affair with the United States, where he would serve as Charles De Gaulle’s leader of the Free French. This period would witness the Maritains’ move to Princeton, Jacques’ publication of Man and the State and Moral Philosophy, other books on metaphysics, art, and poetry, his work with UNESCO and ambassadorship to the Vatican, and the deaths of Vera and Raïssa.
This period would also involve some recently uncovered, and controversial, correspondence between Maritain and Cardinal Journet about artificial birth control. Despite Maritain’s acceptance in this correspondence of some forms of artificial birth control, McInerny claims that, based upon Maritain’s clear loyalty to the Magisterium during the condemnation of Action Française, we can predict that his response to Pope Paul VI’s encyclical Humanae Vitae would have been one of “total acceptance” (p. 183).
After the deaths of Vera and Raïssa, Jacques returned to France, where he joined the Little Brothers of Jesus in Toulouse. While he would spend time working on his journal about his wife and immerse himself in liturgical matters and theoretical theological studies in preparation for his death, dissemination of what McInerny rightly calls “the most controversial book he had ever published” (p. 202) lends credibility to McInerny’s interpretation of Maritain’s loyalty to the Magisterium on the question of artificial birth control. I have little doubt that some Catholic intellectuals will be irritated by McInerny prediction about Maritain’s loyalty to the Magisterium on this issue. They will also likely take issue with him about the influence of Fr. Clérissac on him, and matters related to Gide and Cocteau. Still, he has sound reasons to make his claims.
Whatever the case might be, I think that no scholar worthy of the name can, as McInerny says, seriously “fail to see the life of Jacques Maritain in any terms other than those of the quest for Christian perfection, sanctity” (p. 210). Nor can any serious scholar fail to recognize that this little book is a great introduction to the life and work of Jacques Maritain, written by one of the best Catholic intellectuals of the present time.