2017.08.05

Peter van Inwagen

Thinking about Free Will

Peter van Inwagen, Thinking about Free Will, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 232pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781316617656.

 

Reviewed by Peter A. Graham, University of Massachusetts Amherst


No one writes more sensibly about the traditional philosophical problem of free will than does Peter van Inwagen. This book, a collection of his essays on free will, ought to join his An Essay on Free Will, the best modern treatment of the topic, on the shelf of anyone seriously considering the cluster of issues which constitute the traditional philosophical problem of free will. It is an excellent volume.

 

In what follows I’ll first very briefly canvas some of the main issues touched upon in the essays and then discuss one of them -- the most important, in my view -- in a bit more depth.

 

Among that which is defended in Thinking about Free Will are the theses that:

  1. Frankfurt’s famous counterexample notwithstanding, whether being able to do otherwise than one in fact does is compatible with determinism is relevant to the question whether blameworthiness and determinism are compatible (chapters 1 and 6),
  2. because of the joint plausibility of the Consequence Argument and the Mind Argument, free will remains a mystery (chapters 7 and 10),
  3. the terminology used in much of the contemporary free will debate (including the phrase “free will” itself) obscures the real philosophical issues at play in the traditional philosophical problem of free will (chapters 12 and 13),
  4. the notion of ability central to the traditional philosophical problem of free will is one intimately connected with a certain conception of a defective promise (chapters 7, 11, and 14),
  5. rarely are we ever in a situation such that we are able to do otherwise than we in fact do (chapter 5), and
  6. David Lewis’s response to the Consequence Argument in his “Are We Free to Break the Laws?” fails (chapter 9).

This is not all that is defended in the essays, but it constitutes, in my view, that of what is defended therein which is most interesting. There is indeed a fair amount of overlap across the various essays, but this is a feature rather than a bug, for much of what is repeated bears repeating. Aside from the last of them, I don’t propose to explore in any detail van Inwagen’s arguments for the above-listed theses. I do, however, want to push back on van Inwagen’s response to Lewis’s reply to the Consequence Argument, and I’ll spend the rest of this review doing just that.

 

I share van Inwagen’s admiration for David Lewis’s “Are We Free to Break the Laws?”. (I concur with him in his assessment that it is “the finest essay that has ever been written in defense of compatibilism -- possibly the finest essay that has ever been written about any aspect of the free will problem” (p. 152)). In what follows I shall reiterate the reply to the Consequence Argument Lewis presents in that paper[1] and offer a rebuttal on behalf of Lewis to van Inwagen’s response to it in his “Freedom to Break the Laws” (chapter 9).

 

The Consequence Argument, in whichever form one considers, derives the incompatibility of determinism and our having the ability to act otherwise than we in fact act from our inabilities both to affect the past and to affect the laws of nature. The essence of Lewis’s reply to this argument is to point out that there is a sense -- and, importantly, a nonstandard sense -- of having the ability to affect the past and having the ability to affect the laws of nature which is such that it is not at all counterintuitive to suppose that we have those abilities, and that it is only our having those abilities in such a nonstandard sense that our having the ability to do otherwise in a deterministic world entails.

 

It most certainly is intuitive that I’m unable to affect or change the past. For instance, I’m not able to change or affect the fact that Anne Boleyn was beheaded. It’s also quite plausible that I’m unable to affect or change the laws of nature. For instance, I’m unable to change or affect the fact that angular momentum is conserved. Lewis concurs. But Lewis also points out that my being able to affect or change something, in its standard sense, is my having the ability to make it the case that the thing in question is otherwise than it in fact is. And this notion of making something the case, as we ordinarily understand it, is one that has either a causal or a constitutive sense. I am able to make it the case that a certain window is broken -- i.e., I am able to break the window -- only in virtue of my being able to do something such that were I to do it my doing it would cause the window’s breaking. I am able to make it the case that my arm rises -- i.e., I am able to raise my arm -- only in virtue of my being able to do something such that were I to do it my doing it would be my raising my arm. Whenever we make it the case that something happens, we do so by doing something that either causes that thing to happen or constitutes that thing’s happening, and so our having the ability to make something happen is our having the ability to do something that causes or constitutes that thing’s happening.

 

What is intuitive about our inabilities with respect to the laws of nature and the past is that we aren’t able to make it the case that these things are otherwise than they actually are. But, and here’s Lewis’s point, we needn’t be able to make it the case that a law of nature is broken, or that the past is different from how it actually was for us, to be able to have the ability to do otherwise than we in fact do in a deterministic world.

 

Suppose the actual world, @, is deterministic and that I fail to raise my hand at t1. Supposing also that I have the ability to raise my hand at t1, though it does entail that I have the ability to do something such that, were I to do it, a law of nature would be broken,[2] needn’t entail that I have the ability to make it the case that a law of nature is broken. Remember, my having the ability to make it the case that a law of nature is broken would be for me to have the ability to do something such that, were I to do it, my doing it either would be or would cause a law-breaking event. But we can suppose that I am able to raise my hand at t1 in @ without supposing that I am able to do something such that, were I to do it, my doing it either would be or would cause a law-breaking event. All we need suppose is that were I to exercise the ability I have in @ to raise my hand at t1, the miraculous event, m, in non-actual possible world, w, that would indeed occur were I to exercise my ability to raise my hand would occur sometime shortly prior to t1, at t0, say, and not be caused by my raising of my hand at t1 in w. So long as the event of my raising my hand, r, is neither identical with, nor causes, m in w (rather, it would be m which causes r in w), my having the ability in @ to raise my hand at t1 doesn’t entail that I am able to make it the case that m, or any other law-breaking event, occurs.

 

Van Inwagen complains of this reply that it is, in effect, to attribute to us, ordinary everyday agents such as you and me, the ability to perform miracles. And no one has the ability to perform a miracle. Lewis would agree that no one has the ability to perform miracles. But, he’d go on to note, having the ability to perform a miracle is the ability to make it the case that a miracle happens, and as he’s shown, one can have the ability to do something other than what one actually does in a deterministic world without thereby having the ability to make it the case that a miracle happens. On Lewis’s view having the ability to do otherwise than one in fact does in a deterministic world also entails having the ability to do something such that, were one to do it, the recent (though not the distant) past would have been different from how it actually was. But again, as m would occur prior to, and not be caused by, r in w, this ability would not be an ability to make it the case that the past is different from how it actually was.

 

I imagine van Inwagen would respond to this as follows: “Fine. Having the ability to do otherwise than one in fact does in a deterministic world doesn’t entail having the ability to make it the case that a miracle occurs. Nevertheless, it does entail that one have the ability to do something such that were one to do it a miracle would occur. And that -- just that! -- is implausible.” Here, Lewis would demur. “No, it’s not implausible that one have such an ability. All that’s intuitive is that we’re unable to make it the case that a miracle occurs. And that’s because our ordinary and intuitive notion of being able to do something -- the only notion we can be said to have any robust intuitions with respect to -- is the constitutive/causal notion of being able to make something be the case. We have no robust intuitions (if we have any intuitions at all) as regards other purely counterfactual relations between our abilities to do things and the laws of nature and the past.”

 

What’s more, we can even give some support to Lewis’s contention that we have the ability to do something such that, were we to do it, the past would have been different from how it in fact was, and thereby support the claim that we have the ability to do something such that, were we to do it, the laws of nature would have been different from how they in fact are. Consider the following. In front of Alice is a button. She has no desire whatsoever to press the button at or before t1. In fact, she has no desire whatsoever that could rationalize (to use Davidson’s phrase) her pressing the button at or before t1. And so, she doesn’t press the button at t1. But then we ask her: “Hey Alice, were you able to press the button at t1?” Her reply: “Of course! In fact, I was indeed musing about pressing the button right up until t1, but, having no desire whatsoever to press it, opted against it.” We say: “You say you had no desire to press the button leading up to t1?” “True enough,” she replies. “So would you have wanted to press the button at t1 just prior to t1 had you pressed the button at 1?” “Yeah, I would. Why would I press it if I didn’t?” “So you’re saying you had the ability to do something such that, were you to have done it, the past prior to your doing it would have been slightly different than it actually was -- you would have had a desire which you in fact lacked?” “Yeah. That seems right. I guess I did have that ability.”

 

In our story above we conclude that Alice has the ability to do something, namely press the button, such that, were she to do it, the (very recent) past would have been different from how it actually was. And we reasoned our way to that conclusion from some innocuous assumptions: that she was able to press the button at t1 and that she lacked a desire to press it at and before t1.[3] (Note, in our story, nowhere did we assume either that determinism was true or that it was false.) But if we can support the thought that Alice might indeed have the ability to do something such that, were she to do it, the (recent) past would have been different from how it actually was despite the utter obviousness that she doesn’t have the ability to make it the case that the past (even the recent past) is different from how it actually was, then so too can we see how we might have the ability to do something such that, were we to do it, a law of nature would have been broken, even despite the sheer obviousness of our being unable to make it the case that a law of nature is broken.

 

(We can most certainly describe the ability to do something such that, were one to do it, a miracle would occur, as a way of being able to perform a miracle, if we like. But so describing it would not be the ordinary, standard understanding of what it is to have the ability to perform a miracle. And so, as that’s the case, Lewis can grant the proponent of the Consequence Argument that being able to do otherwise than one in fact does in a deterministic world entails having the ability to perform a miracle in that sense. But granting that is not a serious cost, because it isn’t intuitive that people lack the ability to perform miracles in that nonstandard sense of the phrase.)

 

Lewis’s reply to the Consequence Argument is subtle, but it is decisive. He has located its Achilles heel and shot an arrow straight through it. Does the demise of the Consequence Argument establish Compatibilism? Certainly not. At most, the Lewisian reply merely undermines the best argument for Incompatibilism extant. That’s no small feat, however. And in the absence of any argument for Incompatibilism, Compatibilism’s prospects are no worse than that of its denial.[4]

 

Lewis gets the better of van Inwagen when it comes to the Consequence Argument. This notwithstanding, van Inwagen’s defenses of the Consequence Argument and of all the theses for which he advocates in Thinking about Free Will are significant and very important. For anyone interested in the traditional philosophical problem of free will, one can do no better, aside from reading Lewis’s “Are We Free to Break the Laws?”, than study closely van Inwagen’s An Essay on Free Will and Thinking about Free Will.


[1] Though I shall do this using terminology somewhat different from that used by Lewis in his presentation of the reply, I take it that what I shall present is his reply in its essence. To the degree that I fail to do it justice, that is more a reflection of my own limited philosophical acumen than it is of the merits of the Lewisian reply itself.

[2] More precisely, it entails that I have the ability to do something such that, were I to do it, either a law would be broken or the entire past would have been different from how it in fact was. But if we also suppose (as Lewis does) that I don’t have the ability to do something such that, were I to do it, the entire past would have been different from how it in fact was, we can grant that having the ability to do otherwise than one in fact does in a deterministic world does entail having the ability to do something such that were one to do it a law of nature would be broken.

[3] This is not the conclusion van Inwagen would draw from our story. In fact, he’d say that because she had no desire to press the button, Alice was not able at t1 to press the button. This, after all, is one of the conclusions of his “When Is the Will Free?” (chapter 5). But here we’ve reached an important philosophical decision point. Which is more plausible: that a person have the ability to do something even when they lack a desire to do it, or that one not be able to do something such that were she to do it the (recent) past would have been slightly different from how it actually was? Because it seems quite plausible that having the ability to do something at a time does not simply vanish when one lacks a desire to do it, reasoning from that to the claim that one sometimes is able to act in such a way that the (recent) past would have been slightly different from how it actually was (an ability it is not intuitive that we don’t have) is on surer ground than is arguing the other way around from the impossibility of being able to act in such a way that the (recent) past would have been slightly different from how it actually was to its being impossible to have the ability to do something when one lacks a desire to do it.

[4] In fact, one might think that in the absence of an argument for Incompatibilism, Compatibilism’s prospects are even slightly better than those of its denial. For, on very general philosophical grounds, you might think, in the absence of a reason to think that two things are incompatible, it’s more plausible to think that they’re compatible rather than not.