Philip J. Ivanhoe

Three Streams: Confucian Reflections on Learning and the Moral Heart-Mind in China, Korea, and Japan

Philip J. Ivanhoe, Three Streams: Confucian Reflections on Learning and the Moral Heart-Mind in China, Korea, and Japan, Oxford University Press, 2016, 250pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190492014.


Reviewed by Hui Chieh Loy, National University of Singapore

This book begins by invoking Whitehead's "safest general characterization of the European philosophical tradition" as consisting in "a series of footnotes to Plato" to make the point that many of the concerns and approaches that continue to drive contemporary Anglo-American philosophy remain defined by their remote roots in Plato's dialogues. Similarly, Philip J. Ivanhoe argues, the trajectory of the Confucian tradition has its ultimate source in the approaches to the Way (dào) deployed by the early thinker Mencius (or Mèngzǐ, 391-308 BCE), who was second only to Confucius himself as a founder of the tradition. Within this larger theme, Ivanhoe's book tells the story about what happened when those Mencian approaches came to be modified as latter day thinkers in the Confucian tradition "absorbed idea, values, and styles of reasoning from Daoism and Buddhism" (5).

In Ivanhoe's telling, the critical event is an amorphous development that took place between the late Tang and the early Song dynasties, when thinkers in the Confucian tradition came to share a keenly felt sense that "beneath the evident variety of the world's phenomena" there is a "oneness or identity between self and world, and a corresponding moral imperative to care for the world as oneself" (25). This new metaphysical outlook upon the world, Ivanhoe takes pains to point out, was not so much self-consciously "adopted" from Daoism and Buddhism (its ostensible origins) as it was simply part and parcel of the intellectual milieu inhabited by a wide variety of Chinese intellectuals at that time. What we call the varieties of Neo-Confucianism can thus be seen as competing attempts to fill in the general metaphysical scheme with "distinctively Confucian forms, motifs, colors, and shadings" (25).

It was within this metaphysically inflected framework that Mencius' teachings, which articulated a developmental model of moral development based on agricultural metaphors, came to be supplanted by a discovery or recovery model in Chinese, Korean and Japanese Neo-Confucianism from the 10th to the 19th century. The former is squarely founded on a (broadly empiricist and, in Ivanhoe's view, still entirely defensible) view of moral psychology and philosophical anthropology, in which "finding and following the right way to act and live" is the natural function of our mental-affective faculty (i.e., the "heart-mind") (4). The latter, in contrast, sees finding and following the way as a matter of (re)discovering our "original nature" (akin to Huayan Buddhism's "Buddha nature"), which we already possess, and which contains within it the metaphysical principle of all things. Moral development, on this account, is thus a matter of realizing one's pre-existing interconnection with all things.

Readers familiar with Ivanhoe's earlier works should recognize the broad argument so far.[1] But -- and this is a particular contribution of his new book -- the modification that defined the "Neo" in "Neo-Confucianism" eventually came under critical scrutiny by thinkers in China, Korea, and Japan working independently of each other. These dissenting critics, each to varying degrees, advanced both philological arguments to show Neo-Confucianism's departures from the original intent of the early texts, and also philosophical arguments to show that the Neo-Confucian ideas are unsound in their own right.

After the introduction, the book is organized into three main parts, respectively covering Neo-Confucianism in China, Korea and Japan. Each of these parts is further divided into three main chapters, with the third chapter invariably introducing the dissenting critic. Each part's triplet of chapters is itself sandwiched between a preface that brings readers up to speed on the intellectual historical situation of Neo-Confucianism in the country in question, and a concluding summary that draws together the main ideas discussed in that part. The book then closes with a chapter that briefly relates the themes of the project to the Western philosophical tradition, both historical and contemporary.

Part I, on China, covers Cheng Hao (1032-1085), his brother Cheng Yi (1033-1107), and the dissenting critic Dai Zhen (1724-1777). Some readers might wonder why the two Cheng brothers are selected to represent the range of Chinese Neo-Confucianism. After all, the common demarcation is between "Cheng-Zhu" (i.e., the Cheng Brothers and Zhu Xi [1130-1200]), and "Lu-Wang" (i.e., Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming [1472-1529]) forms of Neo-Confucianism. The reason, as Ivanhoe makes clear, is that key features of Cheng Hao's thinking became "essential components of the Lu-Wang school of Neo-Confucianism" (35).[2] Cheng Yi, on the other hand, takes his place as the precursor to Zhu Xi. Finally, there is Dai Zhen, that "vocal yet respectful critic" of Neo-Confucianism (63), who sought to return to a more faithful -- and naturalistic -- reading of the ancient classics and thus set aside the more metaphysical speculations borrowed from Buddhism and Daoism. Ivanhoe also discusses how several of Dai Zhen's ideas "offer important resources for contemporary moral theory" (63).

Part II, on Korea, has a slightly different organization from the other two parts. Rather than consider two thinkers who might plausibly give us a sense of the range of the options available to the Neo-Confucian tradition (as with the two Cheng brothers, or Nakae Tōju and Yamazaki Ansai in Japan later on), Ivanhoe devotes the two chapters to two intellectual debates in Joseon Dynasty Korea (1392-1910): the so called "Four-Seven" and "Horak" Debates. These various debates mix concerns that go all the way back to the time of Confucius and Mencius (e.g., the status of emotions in moral life); those more recently definitive of Neo-Confucianism (e.g., the relationship between lǐ, or "principle", and qì, the lively material basis of the universe); and beyond that, those to do with orthodoxy and the Korean elite's claim to be "the true inheritor of the transmission of the Way" (115). The last concern became all the more urgent with the collapse of the Ming Dynasty in China to the invading Manchus. Because the cataclysm was widely blamed (unfairly or otherwise) upon the Lu-Wang school and the perceived encroachment of heterodox Buddhist ideas into Confucianism, Korean thinkers were vehement in upholding the Cheng-Zhu form of Neo-Confucianism as orthodoxy. The role of dissenting critic is then played by Jeong Yakyong (or Dasan; 1762-1836).

Part III, on Japan, covers a triplet of thinkers from the Edo Period (1603-1868): Nakae Tōju (1608-1648), who represents a Lu-Wang form of Neo-Confucianism, Yamazaki Ansai (1619-1682), who represents the Cheng-Zhu Orthodoxy, and Itō Jinsai (1627-1705), Ivanhoe's Japanese version of Dai Zhen in China and Jeong Yakyong in Korea. Like his counterparts on the Asian mainland, Jinsai "raised trenchant criticisms of all forms of neo-Confucianism metaphysics but especially the orthodox Cheng-Zhu view and argued for a return to a less metaphysically elaborate and more historically authentic interpretation of the early Confucian tradition" (124). Also interesting are discussions regarding the dynamic tensions and mutual engagements between Confucianism and native Japanese forms of thinking (e.g., Shintō and Bushidō).

It is to Ivanhoe's credit that he has managed to introduce, in a compact form, key ideas from a number of important East Asian Neo-Confucian thinkers and their critics. If the details of Neo-Confucianism are not as well known in the English-speaking world as the works of the early or classical Confucians (e.g., Confucius, Mencius and Xúnzǐ), the works of the Korean and Japanese Neo-Confucians are even less so. Ivanhoe's book adds to the accessibility of these traditions. Specialists of the respective traditions, however, will probably be less satisfied. They might complain that the discussions of the individual thinkers are not nuanced enough, or are too selective, because of the need to fit them within a single narrative of how 'Orthodox' Neo-Confucianism came under independent philological and philosophical scrutiny of a certain sort in China, Korea, and Japan. In a similar vein, they might also grumble that Ivanhoe has given the reader insufficient context: how exactly are those ostensibly 'Buddhist' and 'Daoist' ideas in Neo-Confucianism related to Buddhism and Daoism as such? And how did those ideas come to be so deeply embedded in the intellectual background of the Neo-Confucian thinkers, so that there was not even a question of conscious borrowing? On these questions, the book does not deliver. But these cavils would miss the point: no book of this size should be expected to do complete justice to the richness of the traditions being discussed.

Beyond the more intellectual-historical concerns, Ivanhoe's project also showcases how a variety of thinkers grappled with a concern that is entirely recognizable as strictly philosophical, even to those of us who do not see ourselves as scions of the Confucian tradition: namely, what exactly is the relationship between the right and proper way for us to conduct ourselves and the fundamental nature of the world -- if there is any relationship at all? Can an ethical conception be sufficiently appealing, recognized as rational, and motivating, if it is not grounded in a metaphysics of the world? Or will a more modest set of foundations in our emotional capacities do? These questions still remain with us. In tackling versions of them as they are filtered through the prism of the Confucian tradition and issues more local to China, Korea and Japan, the Neo-Confucian thinkers are thus recognizable as philosophers. As Ivanhoe remarks towards the end of his introduction, he hopes that his book has successfully offered the reader "some sense of the remarkable range of thought one can find within the Confucian tradition and the ways in which different cultural settings and personal challenges oriented, shaped, and inspired distinctive expressions of Confucian philosophy." (15) To this reviewer at least, the book has successfully done just that, especially for those who are relatively new to Neo-Confucianism. And this is an achievement in its own right.


My thanks to Mr. Jeremy Huang and Mr. Wilson Lee for their suggestions and comments.


[1] See for instance, his Confucian Moral Self Cultivation, rev. ed. (Hackett, 2000), and Ethics in the Confucian Tradition, reprint (Hackett, 2002).

[2] Note that this is not a new line; see, for instance, Fung Yu-lan, A Short History of Chinese Philosophy, trans. Derk Bodde (Princeton University Press, 1983), vol. 2, 307.