2019.03.23

Scott Davidson (ed.)

A Companion to Ricoeur's Freedom and Nature

Scott Davidson (ed.), A Companion to Ricoeur's Freedom and Nature, Lexington, 2018, 233pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498578882.

Reviewed by Pol G. Vandevelde, Marquette University


This collection of twelve essays is a welcome and successful attempt to bring back to light one of Paul Ricoeur’s first books, Freedom and Nature, a long (464 pages) and difficult one. It was not Ricoeur’s first monograph. He had published Karl Jaspers et la philosophie de l’existence (co-authored with Mikel Dufrenne) in 1947 and Gabriel Marcel et Karl Jaspers: Philosophie du mystère et philosophie du paradoxe in 1948. Yet, Freedom and Nature, published in 1950, is the first important, consistent effort by Ricoeur to present his own views in a systematic way. The book was intended as the first volume of a larger project on a “Philosophy of the Will.” The French title of this first volume is Philosophie de la volonté: Le volontaire et l’involontaire,1 which became in Erazim Kohák’s translation Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary, published in 1966.2

In this volume on the voluntary and involuntary, Ricoeur uses the phenomenological method to find the “essence” of the will and calls his investigation an “eidetic” of the will. After this pure phenomenological description, the second part of the project was supposed to examine what the first had bracketed, the question of the fault or the fallibility of the human being. It offered what Ricoeur called an “empiric” of the will and appeared in two volumes in 1960 under the general title Finitude and Guilt, Book 1 Faillible Man and Book 2 The Symbolism of Evil. The third part of the project on a “poetics” of the will was never completed as Ricoeur directed his attention to other themes.

In this first volume, Ricoeur opposes the voluntary and the involuntary in order to reformulate the relationship between consciousness and the world from within consciousness. Using the views of Gabriel Marcel, to whom the book is dedicated, on incarnation, Ricoeur sees his project as a “reconciliation” of consciousness with its body and its world. It is a reconciliation because the world is not a container in which I happen to be, but is connected to my projects. Taking from Husserl the notion of the subject as an “I can,” in terms of projects and possibilities, Ricoeur writes: “The feeling of being able, of being capable reveals to me the world as horizon, as theater, and as material for my action.”3 This reconciliation means that the voluntary is only possible based on and nurtured by the involuntary while the involuntary is only such for the voluntary, in the sense that the involuntary only appears, manifests itself, reaches its revelation once the voluntary has been enacted. This is why Kohák, the translator, uses the expression “freedom and nature” as a doublet for the voluntary and the involuntary. As he explains in his “Translator’s Introduction,” “while nature makes freedom actual, freedom makes nature meaningful, and neither can ultimately be separated from the other.”4 This reconciliation between the voluntary and the involuntary is also for Ricoeur a restoration of the unity of the cogito. As he writes, “the theory of the voluntary and the involuntary not only describes, understands, but restores.”5

Ricoeur structures his work in three parts, according to the triadic structure of the act of the will or the “voluntary,” which includes “decision,” “motion of my body,” and “consent.”6 To each level of the “voluntary,” there corresponds a layer of “involuntary.” Against a self-affirming cogito, Ricoeur wants to recover an operation of the cogito within action and decision, what he calls a “pre-reflective imputation of the self,”7 which is a manner of comporting oneself toward oneself and turns decision into an act that is not just made by oneself, but concerns oneself. We can already see in this first major work how Ricoeur identifies the questions and issues that matter to him and how he lays out the framework for his later investigations, from the question of the structure of action, to the nature of self, to the issue of narrative continuity and identity.

In his Companion volume, Scott Davidson manages to give us a very good idea of the breadth and richness of Ricoeur’s first major systematic work. Davidson sensibly divides the Companion into three parts: “Historical Influences,” “Key Themes,” and “New Trajectories.” In his “Introduction” he reminds us of the importance of this work, delineates its place in Ricoeur’s itinerary, and presents a summary of the volume’s essays.

The usual challenge for a collection centered on one single work is to keep contributors focused on that particular work while illuminating it from different perspectives. This collection successfully meets that challenge. With one exception, all contributors bring out original aspects of Ricoeur’s work and make them salient either in their historical provenance (in the first part), in their place in Ricoeur’s overall work (in the second part), or what they gave rise to (in the third part). This is no small achievement for an editor and Davidson is to be commended for such an editorial discipline and success. Let me briefly review each essay.

In the first part, “Historical Influences,” Marc-Antoine Vallée shows how Ricoeur’s project of a subject willing and acting in the world, on the basis of its capacities and possibilities, can be seen as a complement to Merleau-Ponty’s project of perception as the means through which a bodily subject is in the world. While both Ricoeur and Merleau-Ponty want to move away from a self-sufficient Cartesian cogito, avoid the opposition between spiritualism and materialism, and see freedom as “situated,” Ricoeur is particularly sensitive to what may exceed a phenomenological analysis (an “eidetic”), such as the question of the fault. Although Ricoeur bracketed this question in Freedom and Nature, it became central in the second part of his project. As Vallée notes, once Ricoeur moves beyond the will and addresses the question of evil, “Merleau-Ponty is no longer his interlocutor” (p. 14).

Jean-Luc Amalric shows quite persuasively the influence of Jean Nabert in Freedom and Nature. The kind of reflexive philosophy that Nabert developed gave Ricoeur the means to develop “a reflexive method of indirect re-appropriation of the position and capacities of the self” (p. 23). For example, Nabert’s view on motives as being both act and representation or the connection he establishes between what Amalric calls “the act of existing and the signs through which it is objectified” allowed Ricoeur to combine “phenomenological description, the reflexive method, and a hermeneutics of symbols and myths” (p. 19).

Jakub Čapek focuses on Ricoeur’s views on habit and shows the import of Ravaisson’s more spiritualistic approach for Ricoeur’s phenomenological stance. Through a comparison of their views, Čapek clearly shows how Ravaisson’s position is both an inspiration and a challenge to which Ricoeur has to respond in order to secure the reciprocity between the voluntary and the involuntary. Against Ravaisson, Ricoeur has to defend the view, first, that habit only applies to human acts (and not to nature with its inclinations and forces), second, that habit is only an aspect of act (and not a kind of act), and, third, that habit is intelligible as such only when connected to a cogito, i.e. only when it has a “use-value” in the sense that “I know how, I can” (quoted p. 48) (and not as a spontaneity independent of the will).

Michael Sohn examines the influence of Aquinas’ psychology and cosmology in Freedom and Nature. Sohn makes the broad claim that Ricoeur’s work “can be read as an extended, critical, and appreciative reflection on Aquinas’ psychology” (p. 73). Ricoeur criticizes Aquinas’ psychology and medieval cosmology in general for making the will subservient to an objective nature and holds instead that “human action is not determined by the world” (p. 73). Yet, against the assumptions of medieval cosmology, Sohn argues, Ricoeur retrieves insights from Aquinas’ psychology to show that “human action changes [the world]” (p. 73).

In the second part, dedicated to “Key Themes,” Michael A. Johnson discusses Ricoeur’s notion of “attention” and its paradox of being both by the self and about the self. Johnson shows how Ricoeur takes the insights of the Cartesian tradition about attention and integrates them into a Husserlian phenomenological approach based on intentionality. Ricoeur’s originality consists in intertwining attention with imagination in a temporal process. To pay attention is “a kind of intuitive reception . . . and not a second-order reflection on the content of perception” (p. 93). Yet, attention is also a form of active perception in which, through imagination, we entertain relations and values in a temporal process. As such, attention leads to a choice, which is “judgment; conviction; commitment” and pertains to “the becoming of the self” (pp. 101-102).

In his short eight-page contribution, Johann Michel quickly examines the status of the subject in what he calls “Ricoeur’s phenomenology of decision,” which he sees as a reconciliation of what appears to be an opposition between the pre-reflexive and the reflexive aspects of a decision in the Cartesian tradition. Michel suggests that for Ricoeur there can be a self-presence of the subject even if it is not explicit. For example, when the subject projects an action and is absorbed in it, there is a “pre-reflexive self-imputation,” which can be discovered retrospectively by reflection. This raises the question of “How . . . a being that is absent to itself [can] be posited as a moral subject” (p. 115).

Eftichis Pirovolakis analyzes the place and role of Maine de Biran in Ricoeur’s theory of the will, and tests the accusation of voluntarism that Ricoeur raises against Maine de Biran. Because of his Husserlian framework, Pirovolakis argues, Ricoeur only envisages a teleological continuity between the voluntary and the involuntary. He cannot entertain the possibility of a heterogeneity between them (p. 120). Thus, for him, the resistance of objects, or the world in general, cannot just be a purely objective resistance that would be totally external and impermeable to the will. He understands Maine de Biran to hold this position, what Ricoeur calls a “voluntarism,” and criticizes him for focusing too much on “practical effort” or practical action as opposed to “intellectual activity” (p. 125). Pirovolakis appeals to an alternative reading of Maine de Biran by Jacques Derrida in order to show against Ricoeur that “effort” can be understood not as a “primitive fact” and thus not as a cause but instead as an “effect”: as a phenomenal effect of a tension between activity and passivity.

Grégori Jean focuses on Ricoeur’s chapter on “habit” (already dealt with historically in Čapek’s contribution). While habit is not to be situated in a “causally closed nature” (p. 140), as in a traditional philosophy of nature that would naturalize consciousness, habit cannot be reintegrated in the will either, according to a philosophy of consciousness and judgment. By representing the way we exist in the unity of nature and freedom, which lets “us participate in what we cannot understand” (p. 148), habit in fact points to another kind of nature, “a Nature which is no longer the other of freedom” but is understood “in the primordial unity of a nurturer and a nurtured” (p. 150). Jean claims that Ricoeur in Freedom and Nature is already exploring this other nature or alternative nature, to which his later works, such as Fallible Man and Oneself as Another, will give form.

Davidson examines the significance and consequences of Ricoeur’s view that life is both a passivity (as “the background of every subjective experience and activity”) and a task. Davidson analyzes the notion of consent, which is precisely the reconciliation of these two aspects. Instead of being a practical decision changing anything in the world, consent is rather an acceptance of the three figures of the involuntary: first, my character (which makes me unique, yet limits me); second, the unconscious (which prevents self-transparency and self-mastery, and threatens my self-identity); and, third, life (which “sums up all that I have not chosen and all that I cannot change,” quoted p. 167). Davidson argues that Ricoeur’s phenomenological method, which can only describe the divisions of life, fails to account for how life is a force that allows me to say “I am my life’” (quoted p. 171). This failure of an eidetic of the will points to the need for a “poetics” of the will, which was supposed to be the third and never completed part of the “Philosophy of the Will.”

In the third part on “New Trajectories,” Natalie Depraz in a re-print of an earlier essay makes use of some of Ricoeur’s views on the first-person to give traction to her own project. She uses the remarks Ricoeur makes in the introduction to Freedom and Nature on “The Descriptive Method and its Limits,” which she discusses in two pages, and sees in Ricoeur’s “descriptive phenomenology” a reconciliation between empirical psychology and first-person perspective. She builds on this to differentiate the first-person perspective from the lived experience.

Geoffrey Dierckxsens applies Ricoeur’s views on the voluntary and the involuntary to the mind-body problem and sees an interesting connection with enactivism, which approaches cognition as “an active interaction between the body and the physical world” (p. 192). Dierckxsens wants to show not only that Ricoeur’s views on the body fits the enactivism model and can be made actual again through an enactivist framework, but also that Ricoeur can contribute to an enactivist understanding of imagination. Imagination in an enactivist model is “a creative process for adaptation to bodily need” (p. 192). When desiring, for example, “we actively and imaginatively adapt to our bodies as to seek the best way of interacting with our surroundings” (p. 202).

Adam J. Graves focuses on the first form of involuntary (character) and shows how combining some of Strawson’s views on agency with some of Ricoeur’s views on necessity and freedom (with his later move to narratives) can be fruitful for formulating a new kind of freedom. Graves shows, first, that a first-person phenomenological approach cannot account for responsibility but, second, how a narrative theory (Ricoeur) with a normative conception of agency (Strawson) can deal with it. By combining the story we tell about ourselves, taking ownership and responsibility for our past, we acquire a “new” freedom that is “no longer metaphysical, nor merely normative” but “fabulous” (p. 223).

While some contributions in this Companion tend to be more general and others more focused on the detail of Ricoeur’s arguments, and while they are not all of the same high quality, taken together they give readers an excellent idea of the complexity of Ricoeur’s first major work, of its place in French philosophy in the 1950s, and of its influence both on Ricoeur’s later views and on other trends of philosophy.


1 Paris: Aubier, 1950.

2 Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1966.

4 Freedom and Nature, 1966, p. xv

5 Le volontaire et l’involontaire, p. 21.

6 Le volontaire et l’involontaire, p. 10.

7 Le volontaire et l’involontaire, p. 57.