2019.06.21

Candice Delmas

A Duty to Resist: When Disobedience Should Be Uncivil,

Candice Delmas, A Duty to Resist: When Disobedience Should Be Uncivil, Oxford University Press, 2018, 295pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190872199.

Reviewed by Christopher Finlay, Durham University


In this book, Candice Delmas defends quite radical conclusions based on intuitions, principles, and theories frequently cited within a relatively mainstream liberal and cosmopolitan literature: what she calls 'ordinary and critical morality' (9). Her argument builds on three, closely-related ideas: the widespread public endorsement of a right of civil disobedience; the permissibility of methods that exceed the limits of that doctrine; and the deontic status of this permission as a duty rather than a liberty-right. The result is a cogent, insightful, provocative, and original contribution to the political theory of oppression, the philosophical debates about political obligation and its limits, and the ethics of resistance to social injustice and domination.

The belief that people generally have a right of civil disobedience is familiar and, in democratic states, widely-accepted. Some think this right is valid independently of the objective justice of its aims -- people are entitled to object to things that they in good conscience believe to be unjust and so may adopt carefully measured means of communicating their dissatisfaction to society more widely. The right of civil disobedience is familiar from the political philosophy of John Rawls, among others, and the historical example of Martin Luther King and the campaigns for civil rights in the USA. Delmas endorses this right, but wants to add a second and third idea.

The second is that permissible disobedience needn't always to be so civil: while the familiar repertoire of civil disobedience might be suitable to some cases, she argues that other, more severe and intractable examples of oppression, will demand a more robust, 'uncivil' response. According to the common understanding, civil disobedience is defined and limited by three key requirements:

publicity (the agent's performance of the act in the open), non-evasiveness (her acceptance of legal sanctions), and nonviolence (which rules out the use of force and infliction of harm) are necessary to the disobedient act's communicativeness -- its nature as a speech-act -- and civility. (42)

Moreover, Delmas thinks that a 'fourth norm of civility,' that of 'decorum,' has come to be recognized as a further limit on permissible civil disobedience (43).[1] If these are the explicit or implicit terms on which civil means have come to be understood, then uncivil methods will be those characterized by 'covertness, evasiveness, violence, and offensiveness'. Disobedience is uncivil when it possesses any one or more of these attributes (44).

Delmas worries that the public legitimacy of civil disobedience might have done something to disempower the oppressed just as much as to empower them, due in part to the exaggeration of its importance and success in the campaigns of Martin Luther King in the 1950s and 1960s. One reason is that King's movement benefited from its opponents' awareness that more militant, less civil, elements were waiting in the wings. If civil disobedience was ignored, then these others were more likely to take centre stage. If militants -- in some cases threatening violence -- contributed causally to the success of the nonviolence movement, then they might be necessary in similar ways in current struggles. Upholding an ideal of pure civil disobedience and using it to criticize any and all resort to uncivil methods implicates the legacy of King in a strategy of delegitimization and political disempowerment. Secondly, as some recent advocates of mixed methods have argued, the civil rights movement was far less than comprehensively successful in achieving social justice in the USA than popular belief suggests.[2] Black Lives Matter arose, for instance, to confront severe injustices that didn't just fade away in the second half of the twentieth century. It remains to be asked, therefore, whether more challenging methods might still be necessary in some circumstances if the oppressed are to aim with reasonable hope at more comprehensive goals of justice (23; 29-35).

Sincere and principled efforts to combat oppression, Delmas thinks, will sometimes require a combination of both types of method. We therefore ought to recognize a right of 'principled disobedience,' which consists of civil disobedience in some instances, but can extend to uncivil methods in others. The functions of these various different types of act may be communicative, as in classic cases of civil disobedience. But they may serve the legitimate ends of resistance in other ways too: prevention and remedy of wrongs occur when, for instance, citizens assist illegal migrants to enter a state safely, just as when in the nineteenth century sometimes they helped runaway slaves escape their pursuers into the non-slave-owning states of the USA or to Canada. Both actions will necessarily be uncivil because covert and evasive rather than public and non-evasive. At other times, uncivil disobedience may serve the purposes of defence against active harming, as when the Black Panthers offered protection to black Americans from personal aggression.

So Delmas maintains that it is sometimes permissible to engage in 'resistance' against social and political oppression: 'resistance' means 'a multidimensional continuum of dissenting acts and practices, all of which express condemnation of and/or refusal to conform to the dominant system's norms.' It 'applies to a broad range of activities, including petitions, demonstrations, strikes, slowdowns, boycotts, and efforts to work within appropriate legal and political channels' (127-28). But if we express this fact as having a 'right' to principled disobedience, it implies that we have discretion over whether to engage in it. Yet, as Delmas argues, those we associate with the theory and practice of disobedience -- e.g., Thoreau, Gandhi, and King -- tended to express themselves in terms of duty, not of liberty-rights. This leads to the third thought, which is that we ought to take seriously the view that in circumstances where resistance is necessary as a means of responding to serious injustice, it is, in fact, a duty.

To substantiate this central idea of the book, Delmas revisits some of the most influential arguments for the duty to obey the law in order to show how those same arguments support a duty to disobey it in certain (probably not uncommon) circumstances. The political theory of obligation offers four classic types of argument, all of which, Delmas argues, point toward a duty to resist. First, the belief that there is a natural duty of justice to support just institutions also supports a duty to challenge and seek to remedy defects when institutions uphold unjust practices or systems. Wrongs against immigrants and other non-members may demand a response; likewise, a failure to admit 'issues and discourses' that have become 'blocked from the deliberative agenda', officials who sanction misconduct, or a policy of keeping the public in ignorance of issues of clear public importance, may require citizens to resort to uncivil methods of resistance -- such as Edward Snowden's whistle-blowing, for example.

A second category of theories of political obligation supports principled resistance to injustice based on reciprocity and fairness. Participants in social arrangements that cause harm or rely on exploitation have duties not to comply with them and to cease benefiting. Achieving this by means of exit will often be excessively costly (and morally undesirable if the beneficiaries are sometimes needed as agents of change (125)) and restitution may be too complicated (123-24). In which case, 'radical reform' ought to be pursued instead and resistance may be necessary as a means of doing so (124). Samaritan Duty (a third basis for theorists to argue for political obligation) demands that individuals provide assistance to others who are in evident danger of severe harm when doing so isn't needlessly or excessively risky for the intervener. And, fourth, the commitment to a conception of dignity, realized through authentic choices and self-expression in a society built around mutual respect (drawing on Ronald Dworkin), is central to the conception of associative duty that Delmas cites in support of a duty to resist based on membership.

These four lines of argument -- explored in the four central chapters -- serve Delma's purposes in two ways. First, they show how the same conclusion may be reached by a variety of different routes. But they aren't presented simply as alternative arguments. Each also reflects moral principles that proponents of a rival view might take seriously as being relevant for moral and political life, even if they have different views on the best explanation for political obligation. So, second, each core chapter is able to add something to a cumulative, unified case for principled disobedience as a duty.

Delmas's concluding chapter acknowledges that conscientious citizens consequently have very weighty burdens of judgement to make. Not only must they identify true cases of oppression, but they must do so within a potentially global as well as national perspective. Injustices can be blatant, in flagrant acts of violence, but often they are hidden. Concealment can be behind walls and closed doors or, more insidiously, beneath ideological camouflage. And while oppression sometimes has agent-perpetrators, it is often structural. Moreover, in determining how to act, the individual must choose among a potentially vast number of different techniques, from public demonstrations and workplace confrontations to outright violence. Such heavy cognitive and practical burdens point to the need to cultivate civic virtues and promote collective, social dialogues as a means of discharging the vitally important second-order duties of information gathering, deliberation, and judgement.

Delmas's arguments towards a duty to resist are powerful and important. As such, they must be situated in relation to other debates (historic and contemporary) about the ethics of oppression, violence, and resistance. I'd like to highlight two issues in relation to which I think this likely to be particularly useful.

One question concerns the different political relationships that arise between the victims of oppression and its beneficiaries (and bystanders) as a result of alternating theoretical perspectives. Arguably, adopting the point of view of the latter is more likely to lead to a theory in which they are seen as bearers a duty to resist, while the rights and duties of the oppressed are more or less incidental and they come to be seen chiefly as the beneficiaries of resistance. But the history of resistance as an idea has perhaps more often focused on the perspective of the oppressed and the question of resisting it therefore arises in the first instance for (and from) victims rather than those whom oppression privileges. J S Mill was adamant that true liberation from tyranny could only be achieved through the agency of the people oppressed by it.[3] Outside help could only vitiate the process by which meaningful change might be achievable. Marx and Engels viewed the problem in a similar way. In spite of coming from privileged backgrounds themselves, they thought it essential to a viable theory of resistance and revolution that it be devised from the perspective, perhaps idealized, of the oppressed. The same is true of revolutionary theories in the twentieth century that departed from Marxism in order to look more closely at oppression outside the industrialized world. Frantz Fanon, for instance, starts his narrative of resistance and revolution with the subjugated finding themselves with their backs against the wall and finally feeling compelled to fight back.

My suspicion is that, if the theory of justified resistance is devised starting from the perspective of the oppressed, then it is less obviously going to be a matter of duty in the first instance and more likely to stand as a right. Perhaps, to borrow from Jeremy Waldron, it is a right to take up one's responsibilities, but nevertheless something over which the primary stakeholder in resistance should be regarded as having a high degree of discretion.[4] One reason for this has to do with a concern that animated much revolutionary theory historically: the oppressed individual is the only person who can state authoritatively that now is the right time to act. When she says, 'Here I stand, I can do no other,' it indicates that she is ready for the struggle for change. By contrast, when someone else starts a fight on her behalf, there is room for doubt.

Another reason has to do with the risks of resistance and the question of whether those who will be most deeply affected by the struggle are willing at this point to 'brave labour and danger' for liberation, as Mill put it. Political struggle doesn't come with a guarantee of success. Its costs are often likely to befall the oppressed themselves to a disproportionate degree, people who are -- by hypothesis and unlike many of the privileged -- innocent of moral responsibility for the wrongs from which they suffer. Moreover, if their active participation in resistance in large numbers is likely to be needed for victory, then the question of readiness -- part of what Lenin calls political 'maturity' -- is vital for a morally responsible decision by others to engage in forms of resistance that are likely to provoke confrontation.

If this is right, then oppression and the question of resistance require two perspectives and perhaps two normative incidents: the duty-bound privileged and the rights-claiming oppressed. Recognizing this underscores the importance of thinking about the proper relationship between the two parties. Resistance and revolutionary theory have often spent much ink grappling with this issue. How do the educated and (in some respects) relatively privileged (people like Marx, Engels, Pankhurst, and Fanon) relate to those whose lack of education and resources is sometimes part of the very problem that resistance and revolution are intended to overcome? Who has the initiative, here? Do the enlightened simply lead as a vanguard? Or must they be led by the oppressed? And, crucially for a normative theory, to what extent do the oppressed have a right to bestow or refuse consent to be represented in a struggle? Delmas's chapters on fairness and on associative duties dedicate some space to the theme of solidarity and the relationship between in-groups and out-groups. But her focus on duty -- grounded in wrongful benefit and complicity -- means the emphasis often leans towards demands that may be made of the most privileged (see pp. 187-91, 193-97). It will therefore be interesting to see how Delmas's theory of duty can be brought into dialogue with treatments of leadership and legitimate authority in resisting oppression.

Another question concerns the potential for interaction between work on the ethics of violence and Delmas's comments on the functions of violent uncivil disobedience. Sometimes her account leans more towards a view related to current arguments in just war theory and the ethics of armed conflict, which is that a resort to armed force is justifiable only as part of a defensive response to equivalent threats from other agents. Her references at various points to having a reasonable prospect of success and proportionality are consistent with such an approach, as is the example of the Black Panthers. But at other times, she references a starting point for thinking about justified violence that has been taken in quite a different direction by both theorists of violence and activists. Delmas cites Fanon, for instance, in support of the idea that a violent act can defend dignity and restore self-confidence.

But, by contrast with many just war ethicists, the act of violence comes, in Fanon's treatment, to have something more like an existential function and an expressive value rather than one that can be described as defensive. Moreover, his vision of the unfolding violence of decolonization sees violence serving to provoke counter-violence from the oppressor and, in so doing, to activate militancy in an oppressed people. It forces the subjects of colonial rule to take sides and seeks revolutionary success by means of a climactically vicious and terroristic armed struggle. Presenting violence in this way can take us into morally questionable territory, so it would be interesting to see how the ethics of violence implicit in Delmas's political theory might be developed through a comparison with just war analysis on the one side and Fanon's on the other.[5]

Both issues -- of legitimate leadership and initiative and of violence -- are posed by the historical case of the Provisional IRA, an organization that took some guidance from Fanon's text.[6] Delmas cites it as an example in her chapter on associative duties. Bobby Sands appears here as the representative of a wider context of profound social injustice against 'the Irish in Northern Ireland' (presumably meaning either Catholics or nationalists or both). That there were widespread injustices in Northern Ireland at the time the Troubles broke out in the late 1960s is true, as is the assumption that there were grounds for action against it. But how we ought to interpret and evaluate Sands and his cause depends at least to some extent on whether we think the IRA ought to be recognized as the legitimate leadership of Northern Irish victims of oppression. This is a highly contentious matter, particularly from the perspective of non-violent, Northern Irish civil rights activists.[7] So is the question of whether the IRA's decision to resort to armed struggle was either objectively justifiable or representative of a willingness to abandon peaceful politics on the part of those it was ostensibly intended to benefit. To litigate highly controversial cases of this kind we need to draw on both Delmas's analysis of the rights and duties of resistance and accounts of the ethics of political violence, particularly those addressing questions of legitimate leadership.

In connection with these and other matters, Delmas's book is a vitally important contribution to the literature that will reward close engagement from philosophers working in a variety of different fields of political theory.


[1] This is a 'pared-down' version of Rawls's account in which the subjective factors that he required of disobedients  --  'endorsement of the system's legitimacy and acceptance of the moral duty to obey the law'  --  are discarded (44).

[2] For instance, Peter Gelderloos, The Failure of Nonviolence, 2nd edition (Seattle: Left Bank Books, 2015).

[3] J. S. Mill, 'A Few Words on Non-Intervention' (1859).

[4] Jeremy Waldron, 'Dignity, Rights, and Responsibilities,' NYU School of Law, Public Law Research Paper No. 10-83.

[5] On the moral problems raised by the idea of using violence to stoke up conflict, see Christopher J Finlay, Terrorism and the Right to Resist: a Theory of Just Revolutionary War (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 2015), chapter 10.

[6] Richard English, Armed Struggle: the History of the IRA (London: Pan Macmillan, 2003), pp. 234-35, 344-45.

[7] The nonviolent nationalist party, the SDLP, won a majority of nationalist votes in Northern Ireland throughout the duration of the IRA's armed campaign. For a challenge to the claims made by the IRA, see Christopher J Finlay, 'Legitimacy and Non-State Political Violence,' Journal of Political Philosophy, 18.3 (2010): pp. 287-312.