2018.08.26

John Lemos

A Pragmatic Approach to Libertarian Free Will

John Lemos, A Pragmatic Approach to Libertarian Free Will, Routledge, 2018, 184pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138498037.

Reviewed by Kelly McCormick, Texas Christian University


 John Lemos pursues three main theses: (1) compatibilism is false, (2) a Kanean libertarian view of free will is coherent, and (3) despite a lack of empirical evidence we should still believe that this kind of free will exists on purely moral grounds. Given the already vast literature devoted to defending and criticizing (1) and (2), the most original feature of the book lies with Lemos' defense of (3). While I take this argument to be open to serious criticism, I will first discuss what readers might take to be of interest in the earlier chapters of the book.

First, in Chapters 2, 4 and 5 Lemos provides a clear articulation of Robert Kane's libertarianism and attempts to bolster some of Kane's own responses to various objections. To this end these early chapters might serve as a helpful resource for anyone looking for a concise presentation of the features that distinguish Kanean libertarianism from other varieties of agent-causal, non-causal, and event-causal libertarianism. Lemos also offers a persuasive argument for why Kanean libertarianism is preferable to Alfred Mele's "daring libertarianism" [1] in Chapter 5. According to Lemos, Kanean libertarianism delivers a more robust degree of agential control for torn decisions than daring libertarianism, because Kanean libertarian agents and daring libertarian agents make very different efforts in such circumstances.

On Kane's view torn decisions involve dual efforts. At the time of the decision the agent is both trying to A and trying to B. So, when Kanean libertarian agents in this kind of scenario indeterministically decide to A or decide to B they have succeeded in doing precisely what it is they were trying do, regardless of the outcome. However, the same cannot be said for Mele's daring libertarian. Because this brand of libertarianism avoids appeal to dual efforts, the agent in a torn decision is not making an effort to decide to A or an effort to decide to B. Rather, what she is trying to do is simply make a decision. Therefore it cannot be said of the daring libertarian agent that when she decides to A or decides to B she has succeeded in doing precisely what it is she was trying to do. All she has succeeded in trying to do is make a decision. Thus Mele's view is more vulnerable to the objection that the actual decision (to A or to B) is merely the product of one set of reasons and motives "winning out" over another. It is not something the agent herself exercises a sufficient amount of control over to make her ultimately responsible for the relevant decision.

Chapter 3 is devoted to supporting the thesis that compatibilism fails, and does so entirely via appeal to manipulation arguments. Given that debates about manipulation are precisely at the heart of many current defenses of compatibilism, it is unlikely that this brief chapter will be sufficient to motivate any readers already familiar with this literature. Here Lemos' treatment of potential "hard-line" (or bullet biting) compatibilist replies to manipulation cases also seems problematically question-begging. His claim that compatibilist hard-liners who take the stance that "instant agents"[2] can in fact be held morally responsible "just seems wrongheaded" does little to move the needle here (48).

The most original contributions appear in Chapters 6-8, where Lemos lays out his arguments for why we should believe libertarian free will exists purely on moral grounds. Chapter 6 focuses exclusively on Derk Pereboom's hard incompatibilist quarantine model of criminal punishment as an alternative to models that presuppose the belief that libertarian free will exists. Lemos is particularly interested in whether or not the quarantine model can preserve respect for the innocent, and ultimately argues that it cannot. Pereboom offers the quarantine model as an alternative to problematic retributive and consequentialist models, in large part because quarantine would reduce undeserved harm to criminals. But Lemos characterizes even those criminals subject to minimally harmful punishment on the quarantine model as innocent because they do not, according to Pereboom himself, deserve blame in the basic sense. This is an intriguing suggestion, and Lemos argues further that the quarantine model lacks the resources to explain why we should not enact policies and procedures that would lead to the detention of more innocent people who have committed no crimes but are likely to. Such procedures would reduce even more undeserved harm to victims at the cost of only minimally harmful detention of innocent potential criminals. If this is correct, then the quarantine model may require abandoning the inherent wrongness of punishing the innocent, or at least inherit familiar consequentialist difficulties explaining it.

In Chapter 7 Lemos argues that there is a conceptual link between moral obligation and moral failure. He claims that making sense of moral failure presupposes that agents could have done otherwise, or at least could have made themselves such that their character was otherwise at some point in the past, and so moral obligation requires libertarian free will. In light of this, if we are unwilling to accept a significantly impoverished view of moral obligation Lemos argues that we have good reason to believe that libertarian free will exists. However, this argument appears to fall prey to circularity worries regarding how Lemos defines moral obligation, moral failure, and what it means to be a moral agent. While considerations of space prevent me from fully articulating this worry here, readers might note that on Lemos' view being a moral agent in the first place requires being subject to obligations. But, further arguments that those who lack libertarian free will cannot be subject to moral obligations itself appeals to the intuition that such people are not moral agents capable of being "morally bad" in the first place (142-144).

Chapter 8 is the culmination of the book and begins with a criticism of libertarianism from Richard Double.[3] According to Double libertarians are "heard-hearted" because they lack evidence that libertarian free will exists, yet still find it permissible to blame and punish despite this. Lemos interprets Double as claiming that the only way to defend against this charge is for libertarians to offer "a pragmatic argument":

In other words, some libertarians might say that while there's no good scientific, logical, or metaphysical reason to believe in libertarian free will, there are, nonetheless, good moral reasons to do so. (153)

The only line of reasoning Lemos then cites for explaining Double's rejection of this kind of pragmatic argument is the fact that it is "grounded on problematic consequentialist moral considerations" (152). In light of this Lemos attempts to offer what he takes to be a pragmatic argument that is not problematically consequentialist. He does so by appealing to the Kantian principle that we should never treat others as mere means, and argues further that rationally employing this principle requires the assumption that we have libertarian free will (154-158).

Setting aside questions of whether or not this claim is plausible (Lemos only defends it briefly, and with no explicit textual support from Kant himself) the fact that it is a deontological consideration is not sufficient to avoid the deeper objection that Double's charge of hard-heartedness is an instance of. Debates about the success of pragmatic arguments for free will have been at issue in the literature on free will since P.F. Strawson's proposal that even if we could give up the belief that we have free will (a move that he takes to be psychologically impossible for creatures like us) the cost of doing so would far outweigh any gains.[4] Since Strawson, the common thread underlying the rejection of pragmatic arguments has not been the mere fact that they appeal to consequentialist considerations. Rather, the charge against such arguments is that the considerations they appeal to are not sufficient to outweigh the potential cost of subjecting people to the widespread unfairness of blaming and harming them when they do not deserve it. Assessing pragmatic arguments for free will requires us to weigh certain values against one another, and those currently engaged in this debate recognize that the values being weighed can have both a consequentialist and deontological flavor.

So, the mere fact that Lemos appeals to a deontological consideration in arguing that we have a reason to believe that libertarian free will exists is not sufficient to show that this consideration outweighs all other relevant pragmatic considerations, especially the potential cost of blaming and harming those we have no good empirical reason to think deserve it. What Lemos is in need of here is, first, a more thorough defense of the conceptual link between the Kantian principle he cites and the belief that agents have libertarian free will. Furthermore, in order to defend a genuinely pragmatic approach to libertarian free will, Lemos owes readers an argument for the claim that our inability to rationally employ this principle would in fact come at a higher cost than harming those we have no good empirical reason to think deserve it. Unfortunately, no such arguments are to be found here.

In summary, those looking for a clear and concise articulation of Kanean libertarianism and a comparative treatment of this view with other varieties of libertarianism will find the majority of the first half of this book a helpful resource. The arguments in the first half of the book might also provide support for (2), the thesis that libertarianism is coherent. However, readers looking for a novel and potentially persuasive defense of (1) and (3) will be unsatisfied. The arguments here do not provide much in the way of new reasons for thinking that compatibilism fails, or that we should believe libertarian free will exists despite a lack of empirical evidence.


[1] See Alfred Mele, Free Will and Luck (New York: Oxford University Press, 2006), and "Two Libertarian Theories: Or Why Event-Causal Libertarians Should Prefer My Daring Libertarianism to Robert Kane's View," Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement 80 (2017), 49-68. While Mele proposes and develops this view, he does not explicitly endorse it.

[2] See for example Michael McKenna's discussion of "Suzie Instant" in "Responsibility and Globally Manipulated Agents," Philosophical Topics 32 (2004), 169-192.

[3] See Richard Double, "The Moral Hardness of Libertarianism," Philo 5 (2002), 226-234, and "The Hard-Heartedness of Some Libertarians: A Reply to John Lemos," The Journal of Philosophical Research 42 (2017), 313-318.

[4] See P.F. Strawson, "Freedom and Resentment" in Gary Watson (ed.) Proceedings of the British Academy, Volume 48: 1962 (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1962), 1-25.